The Development of Dialectic from Plato to Aristotle

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Jakob Leth Fink (ed.), The Development of Dialectic from Plato to Aristotle, Cambridge University Press, 2012, 355pp., $99.00 (hbk), ISBN 9781107012226.


Reviewed by Nicholas Denyer, Trinity College, University of Cambridge


'Dialectic' and 'dialogue' come from the Greek word for conversation. The dialogue was a literary genre invented by the followers of Socrates to give written representation of dialectic, his conversational style of philosophical reasoning. This style of reasoning requires two people: the questioner and the respondent. The questioner gets the respondent to assert something; the questioner then tests this assertion by putting to the respondent a series of questions. The questioner's hope is that, in answering these questions, the respondent will be led to deny the initial assertion. If so, then the respondent is refuted; if not, then the initial assertion can stand -- at least for the moment. One obvious beauty of dialectic is that the questioner need not claim any expertise on the subject of the conversation. This made the rôle of questioner ideal for Socrates, who liked to say that his wisdom consisted simply in knowing that he did not know anything much.

This book consists of essays on Plato's use of the dialogue, and on the theory and practice of dialectic in Plato and Aristotle. Only incidental passages deal with dialogues by people other than Plato, or with what people other than Plato and Aristotle said and did about dialectic. The essays are too varied for a single description to suit them all. I therefore consider them one by one.

In 'Self-refutation and dialectic in Plato and Aristotle' Luca Castagnoli examines what we miss, logically and philosophically, if we take ancient arguments away from their dialectical context. Some have claimed that the dialectical context is never more than ornamental, that any argument presented in question-and-answer format could be presented just as easily, if less colourfully, in monologue. Castagnoli demonstrates beautifully that this is not so, at least for what have been called 'self-refutation arguments'. He presents four case studies: the argument in Plato's Euthydemus against 'It is impossible to contradict'; the argument in Plato's Theaetetus against Protagoras' slogan 'Man is the measure of all things'; the argument in Aristotle's Metaphysics for the Principle of Non-Contradiction; and the argument of Aristotle's Protrepticus, that we must philosophise, since any attempt to maintain that we need do no such thing is itself philosophising. In all these cases, the self-refutation argument shows, not that the thesis against which it is arguing entails its own negation or is for any other reason false, but rather that this thesis is bound to lose in any dialectical contest.

In 'The role of the respondent in Plato and Aristotle' Marja-Liisa Kakkuri-Knuuttila argues that to understand dialectic, we must appreciate not just the constitutive rules which define what it is to play that game, but also what strategies the players are to follow; for only then will we understand quite what dialectic can achieve and how. For example, when respondents are trapped into denying what they earlier affirmed, does that merely show that they are muddled, or does it disprove what they earlier affirmed? At best the former, with some strategies; perhaps even the latter, with others. That much is clear. But the finer details of this article are not so easy to follow.

Hallvard Fossheim discusses 'Division as a method in Plato'. 'Division' is the term for a kind of definition often found in Plato's dialogues, a definition that constructs a taxonomy and locates the thing to be defined within that taxonomy. Plato tells us what a successful division looks like, but does not tell us how to succeed. For example, to tell us that a successful division cuts reality 'at the joints' (Plato, Phaedrus 265e) is not to tell us how to find where the joints are. Division therefore, concludes Fossheim, is a method, not for making discoveries, but only for presenting them.

In 'Dialectic and dialogue in the Lysis' Morten S. Thaning presents this dialogue as living up to its name ('Release') in two different ways, apart from the obvious one that a main character is called Lysis. The dialogue helps release the naïve Lysis from false authorities by enticing him from other pursuits into philosophy, and it helps release sophisticated dialecticians from perplexity by offering them materials for a definition of friendship. This strained word play is alas emblematic of a certain laboriousness in the prose of the article, which offers us passages like

the process of division and collection is also at work in understanding the necessary implications of a definition, for example, when it becomes clear that the ontological distance to the object of non-reciprocal friendship does not imply a relation of pure otherness, but rather a relation of ontological kinship. (p. 131)

Dialectic was often highly combative. In 'The Laches and "joint search dialectic"' Holger Thesleff examines dialectic in a more cooperative mode. He suggests that Plato inherited from Socrates a combative style of dialectic, that this combative style was to the fore in Plato's earliest writings, that with the foundation of the Academy onwards Plato was concerned to advertise a less combative style of education, and that this explains the cooperative tone of much of Socrates' reasoning in the Laches. And the larger picture is that 'positive argumentation by the philosopher in cooperation with his interlocutors takes over as a new trend in the Academy' (p. 155), and 'became the heart of both Platonic and Aristotelian philosophy' (p. 157). This is a refreshing variation upon the usual story of how Plato 'developed' beyond his 'early' or 'Socratic' phase; but, like the usual story, it still relies on hazardous conjectures about the dating of Plato's works.

Charles Kahn gives a pleasingly crisp and plausible account of 'The philosophical importance of the dialogue form for Plato'. Plato, suggests Kahn, means us to grasp philosophical truths not easily formulated in doctrines. Such a truth is best expressed by a multiplicity of variants on a multiplicity of what Kahn calls 'schemas', none of which can impart more than some of the truth. For example, essentially the same truth about intellectual progress is expressed both when the Republic talks of coming out of the Cave to see the Good, and when the Symposium talks of lovers rising to the vision of the Beautiful: these are both variants on one schema. And it is still essentially that same truth expressed when the Meno, the Phaedrus and the Phaedo describe intellectual progress not as ascent and vision, but instead in variants on another schema, as various sorts of recollection. These variations between and within schemas are often taken to show that Plato changed his mind. Kahn suggests instead that they are simply so many ways, less inadequate collectively than individually, of getting the same truth across. And the literary form best adapted to present multiple variants on multiple schemas is not the treatise, but the dramatic dialogue. For the dramatic dialogue allows an author to present multiple perspectives without endorsing any of them as final.

In addition to a useful introduction as editor, Jakob Leth Fink provides an article as contributor. It asks 'How did Aristotle read a Platonic dialogue?' The answer is that Aristotle paid some lip service to the idea that dialogues represent character, but was more interested in extracting arguments. This article also includes some discussion of the scanty fragments of Aristotle's own dialogues. It concludes by showing how dialectical Aristotle's argument in Nicomachean Ethics can be, by reconstructing some of it as a stylised conversation.

Socrates often invites people to tell him what something -- virtue, justice, piety, or whatever -- is. The formula for 'What is . . . ?' is 'Ti esti . . . ?' Vasilis Politis asks 'What is behind the ti esti question?' His answer is: 'radical aporia'. You are in an aporia when you seem to have good reasons to think something true, and also good reasons to think it false. Your aporia is radical when it makes you doubt whether even a supposedly exemplary instance of some kind actually is of that kind. For example, you may have seen Protagoras in action, and have come to think that he teaches virtue, if anyone does. But you then come to have good reasons for thinking that virtue is teachable, and good reasons for thinking that it isn't (this is your original aporia). In consequence, you come to doubt that even Protagoras is a teacher of virtue (this makes your aporia radical). Radical aporia about so-and-sos is the motive for asking 'What is a so-and-so?' and expecting that the answer will meet Socrates' requirements for a definition. For example, Socrates requires that we define so-and-so by giving some general formula, rather than listing exemplary instances; and this is entirely reasonable if there are no exemplary instances.

Politis' argument leaves me puzzled. Why can't we want to know whether virtue is teachable even if we have yet to encounter any reasons at all, good or bad, for thinking that virtue is teachable, or for thinking that it isn't? (You can want to know whether an ailment is contagious even if you have met no reasons for any answer to that question.) And if we do want to know whether virtue is teachable, how can we be helped by a list of exemplary virtues, and how can we not be helped by knowing that virtue is knowledge? Moreover, if we are in a radical aporia, having come to doubt whether even Protagoras is a teacher of virtue, why should our radical aporia make us ask what is virtue, rather than what is a teacher of virtue, or what is a teacher? Furthermore, if our radical aporia does make us ask what is virtue, why should it make us dissatisfied with an answer that purports to list exemplary virtues? There would indeed be no exemplary teachers of virtue for us to list. But why would that matter when it is not teachers of virtue that we want to define?

Hayden W. Ausland writes under the title 'Socratic induction in Plato and Aristotle.' This title understates the richness, complexity, and subtlety of the piece, which incorporates Socratic inductions in Xenophon and Antisthenes, and draws on the diverse ways in which inductive argument was handled by post-Aristotelian writers on logic and rhetoric. In particular, after Ausland's exposition, the inductive argument in Republic 349b-350c will never look the same again.

'Elenchus' is the term for what happens to a dialectical respondent who is refuted. Louis-André Dorion's 'Aristotle's definition of elenchus in the light of Plato's Sophist' takes its start from Sophist 230b-e. Here the Visitor from Elea (whom p. 254, by a pleasing slip, names 'Socrates') describes elenchus and gives a moralised account of its purpose and effects: someone who has been refuted is humbled, and cleansed, and consequently improved. Aristotle takes up some elements from Visitor's description, but makes no comparable claim about the moral effects of elenchus. This, Dorion plausibly suggests, is because Aristotle does not share the Visitor's allegiance to Socrates's thought that virtue is knowledge; for unless virtue is knowledge, we cannot presume that the intellectual improvements effected by elenchus will automatically be moral improvements too.

Not all refutation is fair and square: sometimes, it is cheating, or 'sophistical elenchus.' In 'The Aristotelian Elenchus' Robert Bolton uses what Aristotle says about sophistical refutation to decide what Aristotle thinks about the genuine article. He concludes that a genuine refutation will prove not only that the respondent is inconsistent, but also that the respondent's initial assertion was false. This argument would be more persuasive if it did not, on p. 276, interpolate the phrase 'a syllogistic proof' into its translation of an Aristotelian remark about elenchus.

In 'Aristotle's gradual turn from dialectic', Wolfgang Kullmann writes an intellectual biography in which Aristotle begins with an enthusiasm for dialectical reasoning, and ends by reasoning about metaphysics and natural science in quite undialectical ways. Kullmann gives much detail about contrasts in what Aristotle says about different styles of reasoning in different works. There are however two reasons why the chapter leaves me unsatisfied. First, Kullmann is not careful to explain why these contrasts are to be understood as chronologically ordered stages of a process in which Aristotle turns from one style of reasoning to another; indeed some phrases, like 'the natural, and probably also chronological, sequel' (p. 299), 'possibly, either partly or wholly, composed very late' (p. 310), and 'if not chronologically then at least systematically' (p. 311) leave it unclear quite how chronological Kullmann's claims are. And second, Kullmann operates with a contentious notion of dialectic, a notion that leads him to say that in the arguments of Metaphysics Γ4 'the law of contradiction is established empirically, not dialectically' (p. 311). One can understand why Kullmann should say 'empirically': those arguments rely on empirically verifiable assumptions, like the assumption that someone is trying to contest the law of contradiction, and is managing to say something meaningful. But that hardly justifies the 'not dialectically'. At any rate, the very fact that those arguments rely on assumptions about the occurrence of conversations would make them, by Castagnoli's standards, paradigmatically and ineliminably dialectical.