The Development of Ethics: A Historical and Critical Study; Volume I: From Socrates to the Reformation

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Terence Irwin, The Development of Ethics: A Historical and Critical Study; Volume I: From Socrates to the Reformation, Oxford University Press, 2007, 812pp., $125.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780198242673.

Reviewed by Dimitrios Dentsoras, University of Manitoba


In the first volume of his Development of Ethics, Terence Irwin undertakes the ambitious task of offering a historical and critical study of moral philosophy from Socrates to the Reformation. Unlike other works on the history of ethics, Irwin does not simply give a sequential exposition of various historical moral theories, accompanied by an account of the possible philosophical foundations and merits of each theory. Rather, Irwin views the development of ethics as part of a tradition -- what he calls the "Socratic tradition," which he approaches in a critical manner. Not afraid of expressing his own philosophical preferences, Irwin places Aristotelian naturalism at the center of his exposition, and defends its importance in the history of ethics, as well as its basic philosophical soundness. He does so while remaining historically sensitive and accurate. Irwin achieves this by restricting his critical comments to their historical context, and showing that the original texts are rich enough to express (and perhaps reply to) our contemporary critical philosophical demands. Irwin is aware that his approach is not the only one, but argues convincingly that it is an important one that can promote our understanding both of ethics and of its history.

Irwin begins -- quite naturally -- with Socrates, placing him at the starting point of a long tradition in philosophical ethics. In a concise and enlightening manner, Irwin sets out the main issues in ancient ethics and presents the Socratic position as it emerges from Socrates' dialectical methodology. Using the Platonic dialogues as his guide, Irwin nicely sketches Socratic rationalism and eudaimonism, and briefly presents some arguments for the claims that virtue is a sort of knowledge and that virtue is all one needs to be happy. Arguments for hedonism (in the Protagoras) and for the adaptive conception of happiness as matching one's desires to one's resources (in the Gorgias) are the starting points of Irwin's discussions of the Cyrenaics and Cynics (whom he calls the "one-sided Socratics"). Irwin disagrees with one-sided Socratism and its abandonment of either rationalism or eudaimonism, and shows how the Platonic works contain enough arguments against the one-sided Hellenistic interpretations of Socrates' views. There are still, however, some problems with the Socratic position (after all, many of the so-called Socratic dialogues end with aporetic conclusions), and Irwin briefly sketches some of Plato's own answers, focusing mostly on Platonic moral psychology, as it emerges from the Republic and Philebus.

Although an account of the soul is absent from Socrates' aporetic attempts to define moral terms, Irwin thinks there are good reasons for taking an increased emphasis on the human soul, and human nature in general, to be a normal development of (or rather addition to) the Socratic position. And, as becomes increasingly evident in the course of the book, Irwin believes in general that moral psychology and the account of agency and responsibility play a central role in formulating ancient and medieval accounts of the good. As Irwin maintains, the Platonic tripartite division of the soul offers an argument in favor of the view that justice, and virtue in general, is a non-instrumental good, yet it also leads to the abandonment of the Socratic view that virtue is sufficient for happiness (an abandonment that is not explicit in the Republic, but becomes clear in the Philebus). The chapter on Plato concludes with a discussion of the origin of our concern for others (which may appear to conflict with eudaimonism, at least prima facie) through an account of other-concern as the virtuous person's attempt to pass on his valuable traits to others (an account that takes us, as Irwin maintains, pretty close to Aristotelian friendship).

Turning to Aristotle, Irwin "begins where Plato and Socrates left off" (115) since, as Irwin admits, Aristotle mostly (though not always) defends Platonic moral positions. What Irwin seems to consider Aristotle's main contribution to moral philosophy, which would warrant recognizing Aristotle as the representative of the "ancient view" (114), is the fact that Aristotle offers the fullest and best articulated presentation and defense of moral naturalism and the eudaimonistic account of morality. Following the main argumentative structure of the Nicomachean Ethics, Irwin begins by discussing the final good, which Aristotle identifies with happiness, as a concept that satisfies certain criteria (self-sufficiency, completeness, comprehensiveness, etc.). In the following chapter, Irwin attempts to give some content to the Aristotelian notion of happiness that goes beyond these formal criteria. He does this by means of the function argument which maintains that the good is fulfilled by a living being when it properly performs the function that is essential to its being. Irwin considers the function argument to be the basis for Aristotelian moral naturalism, since it connects the good (the goal of action) with an account of human nature. In the case of human beings, the highest good, i.e. happiness, is achieved through "the rational choice of actions valued for their sake" (139). This choice is identified by Irwin with moral virtue, which is concerned with action.

Chapter 8 contains an analysis of Aristotelian virtue. Here Irwin convincingly argues for Aristotle's rationalism (although he does give some reasons why one would think otherwise), based on Aristotle's account of deliberation, incontinence, and moral responsibility. According to Aristotelian rationalism, Irwin maintains, the virtues of character are not just end-providing mechanisms that habituation shapes, but stem from reason considering different ends in light of its view of human nature: "action on wish is rational in some sense that goes beyond simply acting on deliberation about a non-rational desire; and so a wish must be rational in some sense that goes beyond simply being influenced by deliberation" (174).

In his final chapter on Aristotle, Irwin discusses the question of the normative content of virtues. Unlike Plato, who accomplished this through a metaphysical account of the Forms, Aristotle, according to Irwin, turns once again to an analysis of rational human nature, and places morality and its requirements (Irwin mentions impartiality, concern for others, responsibility, and importance) within the eudaimonistic framework of his naturalism. Irwin presents the fine (kalon) as the overarching Aristotelian moral goal that all virtues share and identifies it with the common good. But, one may ask, why should we be attracted to the common rather than the private good, and set it up as the goal of all action and the seed of happiness? Because of our rational nature, Irwin replies for Aristotle: "In claiming that the rational pursuit of the fine involves concern for a common good, Aristotle implies that if we live in accordance with reason, we are concerned for a common good" (207). This might seem like a questionable position (one that modern philosophers tried to amend by divorcing happiness from morality). But Irwin supports its soundness by showing that it is based on an essentially attractive account of human nature. He further supports the Aristotelian position through discussion of Aristotle’s account of friendship in the Nicomachean Ethics.

Moving on to Hellenistic philosophy, Irwin presents some objections against Aristotle's naturalism that stem from ancient Skepticism. He defuses the Skeptic objections by insisting that a life without some rationally justified beliefs could never be an ordinary or happy life, as we commonly conceive it. He similarly defends Aristotelian ethics against Epicurean hedonism. Irwin presents the Epicurean views on moral responsibility and their account of the different sorts of pleasures. And he objects that, from an Aristotelian standpoint, the value of virtue (which the Epicureans lauded) cannot be justified by positing pleasure as the ultimate end and trying to show that virtue produces the most of it. According to Irwin, Epicureanism fails to reply to the Aristotelian standpoint on two counts: it fails to show pleasure to be the specifically human good, as Aristotle would require; and it also does not support virtue as a goal in itself.

In Chapters 12 and 13, Irwin moves to the most worthy adversary of Aristotelian ethics: the Stoics. While discussing the Stoics, Irwin maintains an Aristotelian perspective. So he leaves aside the theological underpinnings of the Stoics' moral theory, although he recognizes that they play an important role in their ethics, and focuses on their account of moral preconceptions (such as the view that virtue is a non-instrumental good). Irwin discusses these preconceptions in the context of the Stoic theory of moral development. He notes that they have elements in common with Aristotelianism, the most important of which is the view that virtue is the perfection of rational agency. Starting from this Aristotelian approach, Irwin attempts to show that the Stoic views on the sufficiency of virtue could be accepted even by Aristotelians (339-41), and that the Stoics were attempting to amend and expand Aristotle when they claimed that the wise man experiences no passions (346). Irwin even detects some Aristotelian elements in the Stoic views on friendship, although the Aristotelian notion of friendship is based on the view that there are goods beside virtue (a claim that the Stoics denied).

Irwin's Aristotelian approach to Stoicism, which focuses exclusively on the debate between Peripatetics and Stoics about indifference and stochastic crafts, differs from much of contemporary scholarship, and appears, I believe, somewhat excessive. Undoubtedly, there are elements from Aristotelian naturalism that the Stoics borrowed. This is, after all, why the Stoics were accused of being Peripatetics with a different terminology. But one could hardly claim that the Stoics saw themselves as trying to take Aristotle's ethics to their rational conclusion. Doing so would ignore the Stoics' Socratic inspirations, and would undermine their commitment to the view that virtue is some sort of knowledge that is both necessary and sufficient for happiness.

Irwin's account of Hellenistic moral theories is followed by a lucid discussion of Christian theology and moral philosophy. Christianity, as Irwin admits, is not primarily a system of morality and Christian theologians are not primarily moral philosophers. Yet they do have moral views that, on the one hand, are responsive to philosophical arguments (from both pagans and Christians), and, on the other, bear an essential connection to theological views. The remainder of Irwin's volume deals, for the most part, with a re-evaluation of ancient moral philosophical theories (mainly Aristotelian rationalism and eudaimonism) in light of distinctly Christian accounts of human nature and responsibility. A more general such account appears in Chapter 14. There, Irwin avoids the common approach of merely identifying pagan philosophical influences on Christian moral views, and instead attempts the more ambitious and fruitful goal of showing why "while Christian writers express controversial views about morality, these views do not require a moral theory outside the range of theories defended by the Greek moralists" (396).

The following chapter, devoted to Augustine's moral positions, poses a straight-forward objection to this view. On the one hand, Augustine's distinction between the city of God and the earthly city might seem to undermine Aristotelian eudaimonism, while the notion of the will as a faculty that can act against wisdom's view of the greater good seems to reject Aristotelian rationalism in favor of some sort of voluntarism. Irwin tries to show that, despite initial appearances, Augustine's views on human rationality and happiness, when properly understood, do not really differ from the ancients'. He attempts to demonstrate the similarities between Augustine and ancient rationalists by comparing his account of passions with that of the Stoics, finding that the two are not as sharply different as one may think. Similarly, Irwin suggests that Augustine's conception of happiness and its relationship to virtue and morality does not require the rejection of the ancient views. Rather, it modifies them by limiting to this world the happiness that moral virtue can attain, while maintaining that full happiness can be attained only in the afterlife. Thus, Irwin maintains that Augustine "believes that pagan philosophy has identified genuine elements of the human good" (433), while Christianity amplified the scope of the goods to include those of the city of God.

Irwin next focuses on Aquinas (Chapters 16-24). He notes that this might seem an odd choice but defends it by arguing that Aquinas is the linchpin connecting ancient moral philosophical tradition (exemplified by Aristotelian naturalism) with modern ethical theories. Irwin boldly presents Aquinas as not only an interpreter of Aristotle, but also as a defender (on philosophical grounds) of essentially Aristotelian moral views and a believer in the essential compatibility between pagan and Christian moral views. Chapters 16 and 17 discuss Aquinas' positions on the will and action. Irwin starts with the view that Aquinas derives his ethical theory from conditions on rational agency and a notion of the will as rational desire. He maintains that, although Aquinas places an emphasis greater than Aristotle’s on the will and its freedom, his theory of action does not differ much from Aristotle's. Introducing a strong notion of the will does not have to result in voluntarism (the view that the will acts independent of reason's judgment). Rather, Aristotle's theory of action allows for moderate intellectualism, which is, Irwin says, the theory that Aquinas endorsed (472). According to this theory, the will can deny both the partly irrational passions and some of reason's decrees, although in an important sense it stems from reason and is not independent from it. In Chapter 18, Irwin discusses the problem of free will and determinism in Aquinas, within the context of moderate intellectualism, and attempts a solution by locating freedom in deliberation and emphasizing the fact that we can rationally review any irrational desires. This, Irwin admits (491), is only a modest solution (at least by modern standards) that follows argumentative lines similar to those of the Stoics and Aristotle.

Chapter 19 turns to the question of the ultimate end, whose existence is required by the will's function and by deliberation. Irwin (in agreement with ancient eudaimonism) identifies, once again, the summum bonum with happiness understood as the perfection of rational nature (497). As such, happiness is a comprehensive good that goes beyond simply satisfying non-rational desires. This is the notion of happiness that Aquinas also shares: "according to Aquinas the ultimate end is happiness, understood as the perfection of the agent rather than simply the satisfaction of the agent's desires" (502). For Irwin, Aquinas admits the existence of external reasons for natural preferences that pose restrictions to what one should desire as a rational being (500). This, according to Irwin, is accomplished through the doctrine of intellectual love.

So far, Irwin has not presented any uniquely Christian features of Aquinas' thought, but rather seems to have based any difference from Aristotelian ethics on philosophical grounds. One of the few distinctly Christian ideas appears in Aquinas' notion of otherworldly happiness and the restrictions this notion places on eudaimonism. Aristotelian happiness, Irwin notes, has all that can be reasonably expected in this life, but lacks the vision of God which is simply impossible to attain in this life. So Aristotle, even though basically right on his (limited) account of happiness, fails to account for a significant source of motivation that could justify non-social life choices, such as monasticism.

Irwin also considers the basic agreement between Aquinas and Aristotle in the next chapter (on moral virtue) in which he discusses the important moral question of other-regard, its origin, justification, and relation to the will. Irwin holds that Aquinas has in mind a supervisory function of moral virtue (moral virtue, based on charity, directs intellectual virtue) which stems out of his account of the will and the Christian notion of charity. This view, Irwin claims, might not be Aristotelian in origin or basis, but it is not an un-Aristotelian doctrine either (529). The chapter ends with a discussion of sin within the context of Aristotelian incontinence, where Irwin suggests that Aquinas, although not disagreeing with Aristotle, uses a broad notion of sin which makes it possible to claim that even the virtuous are not free from sin, and, therefore, need the grace of God.

Chapter 21 offers an illuminating discussion of Aquinas' notion of natural law. Avoiding a legalistic account of Aquinas' thought and connecting reason, law, and human nature through an account of deliberation, Irwin argues that the basis of natural law (as Aquinas conceives it) is not just some anthropological or psychological feature of human beings (such as the desire for sociability, or the pursuit of happiness, understood as pleasant satisfaction). Rather, it comes out of the function of reason, and is, thus, the result of a faculty we share with God. In this sense, natural law is part of eternal law.

Aquinas' thoughts concerning natural law are carried over to the discussion of practical reason and prudence in the following chapter, where Irwin investigates the question of the source of ultimate ends. Aquinas, according to Irwin, answers this question with reference to universal conscience, which is available to all rational agents, and which functions as a source of moral principles. This is an answer that Irwin, once again, finds in line with Aristotle' position although it contains no explicit Aristotelian precedent.

After a discussion of the canon of virtues (primarily justice, which Irwin bases on an account of -- more or less Aristotelian -- friendship) and an argument for their reciprocity, Irwin concludes his discussion of Aquinas by returning to the issue of moral responsibility (a central notion in the whole of Irwin's book). Contrasting previous claims about Thomistic moral psychology (moderate intellectualism that accounts for freewill) with Christian theological views (mainly, original sin and divine grace), Irwin concludes that seemingly conflicting notions can be reconciled by a Thomistic moral theory that on the one hand differs from Aristotle's, while on the other does not contradict the main Aristotelian moral positions. Irwin ends the chapter with an interesting attempt to find a unifying account of secular and Christian virtue.

The remainder of the book sketches a transition from ancient rationalism, intellectualism, and eudaimonism, to the modern conceptions of ethics, as expressed by Hobbes and Hume. Irwin considers the reinterpretations and critical reformulations of Aristotelian moral doctrine undertaken by later medieval theologians, such as Scotus and Ockham. His discussion of moral philosophy in the period of the Reformation, with which the volume concludes, presents the theological and psychological roots of modern ethics. Irwin considers Luther's criticism against key ancient moral ideas (intellectualism, eudaimonism) in their Scholastic formulation, and maintains that Luther's objections do not demolish the Aristotelian moral position. He does so, once again, by offering some reasons for thinking that Aristotelian naturalism still contains attractive elements, even after making some concessions to Luther. These elements account for moral naturalism's permanence even within the Catholic Church (which defended Scholasticism against the Reformers and had no hesitation about siding with the ancient pagans). The volume includes a not overly extensive bibliography, which contains the most important relevant historical texts and select scholarly works, and a useful index.

The large number of Irwin’s bold, incisive, and thought-provoking claims makes it difficult to single out any particular view and discuss its philosophical merits or deficiencies. Irwin's general position in favor of Aristotelian naturalism is, of course, not an indisputable choice, but Irwin does a good job presenting its strengths from the historical and philosophical perspective. Irwin's choice to treat Western moral philosophical tradition as a critical engagement with Aristotelian naturalism is the basis of a dialectic that raises his book from being a mere history of moral philosophy to being a work of genuine philosophical reflection. At the same time, this approach has some (admitted) disadvantages. One is its somewhat repetitive character, which leads to its great length. This is a flaw that Irwin admits but considers a necessary evil. A second apparent problem is the occasional one-sidedness of Irwin's approach which focuses too much on certain topics that fit Irwin's theme and his philosophical development theory, while leaving out other equally important (both then and now) aspects and views (for example, Platonic metaphysics and its effect on Plato's ethics, or the role of natural theology in Stoic ethics). But, as Irwin points out, his Development is meant to be neither an exhaustive history of ethics, nor a presentation of the relative influence of all historical moral views on contemporary ethics. Rather, it provides the novice in ethics with a challenging introduction to moral philosophical thinking and the more experienced scholar with a host of bold yet clear positions that invite philosophical consideration and reflection. We can look forward to more of the same in the upcoming volumes that continue and conclude Irwin's extensive project.