The Devil in the Details: Asymptotic Reasoning in Explanation, Reduction and Emergence

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Batterman, Robert W., The Devil in the Details: Asymptotic Reasoning in Explanation, Reduction and Emergence, Oxford University Press, 2001, 160pp, $35.00 (hbk), ISBN 0195146476.

Reviewed by C.A. Hooker, University of Newcastle


I. Overview

Asymptotics is the study of what happens in some mathematical domain, e.g. quantum theory, as one of its parameters tends to zero, e.g. as Planck’s constant h → 0, yielding Newtonian mechanics. Sometimes (mostly not) there are phenomena unique to the asymptotic domain near zero, e.g. so-called quantum chaos, and sometimes (mostly not) the behavior in the limit at zero is suddenly different, e.g. at h = 0 quantum theory becomes Newtonian - these are the interesting, and important, cases.

Batterman reviews asymptotics and discusses leading cases in detail, deriving many interesting mathematical and scientific consequences but also arguing important philosophical lessons concerning explanation, reduction and emergence. It is not hard to see a connection: reduction is about inter-theoretic relations and where these are controversial they are characterized by asymptotic relations, as in the quantum-Newtonian example above, while Batterman argues that the unique phenomena of the asymptotic domain present a new and important—perhaps the only real—kind of emergence. And since reduction is traditionally construed as a form of explanation, asymptotic explanation must be distinctive, and so it is argues Batterman, since it is concerned, not with detailed micro causal explanation but with what emerges when information is systematically excluded (via the terms involving the vanishing parameter).

The philosophical interest runs throughout The Devil in the Details as its chapter headings (following Ch.1 Introduction) indicate:

Ch.2 Asymptotic Reasoning: introduces the main philosophical issues, as above, with simple asymptotic examples.
Ch.3 Philosophical Theories of Explanation: makes out the explanatory distinction above.
Ch.4 Asymptotic Explanation: explains how universal features emerge as information is excluded, introduces the Renormalization Group and its treatment of thermodynamic phenomena like heat flow and critical points.
Ch.5 Philosophical Models of Reduction: advances the theses (i) that the problem of multiple realization, e.g. of many brain states realizing one mental state, and of the ‘special sciences’ in general, is the main issue for theories of reduction, and (ii) that asymptotic universality provides its key cases—and thereby an account of why reduction fails and what supplants it.
Ch.6 Intertheoretic Relations - Optics: explores in detail the complex and fascinating case of the short wavelength/ high frequency limit of wave optics, showing its relation to ray optics, illustrating more universal phenomena in the wave optics asymptotic domain, e.g. rainbows—but arguing that their characterization is nonetheless ineliminably dependent on appeal to ray optic features.
Ch.7 Intertheoretic Relations - Mechanics: explores in detail the equally complex and fascinating case of the h → 0 limit of quantum mechanics, showing its relation to Newtonian mechanics, illustrating more universal phenomena in the quantal asymptotic domain - including the problem of so-called quantum chaos, which depends on a second limit, t →∞, that does not commute with h → 0, but arguing that their characterization is nonetheless again ineliminably dependent on appeal to Newtonian features.
Ch.8 Emergence: argues the emergence thesis presented earlier.

This is followed by a Conclusion (Ch.9), select bibliography and adequate index.

II. Exposition

An asymptote in mathematics is a limiting value of a function, which is approached indefinitely closely but never quite reached, except by carrying some approximation process literally to infinity. Consider, for instance, the function y =1/x, x a real number; 1/x is always finite for x > 0, its limit as x becomes indefinitely large (x → ∞, ‘infinity’) is zero, Limx → ∞ (1/x) = 0, and Limx → 0 (1/x) = ∞. So there are two asymptotes for the hyperbolic curve y = 1/x: y = 0 (the x axis) and x = 0 (the y axis). An asymptotic domain refers to the region ‘near’ an asymptote and asymptotic theory is the (mathematical) theory of what happens in the asymptotic domain and ‘in the limit’ at the asymptote. In the case of 1/x, e.g., the asymptotic domains are the domains of very small and very large numbers and asymptotic theory would be the theory of the curve properties for these numbers. For 1/x, no new arithmetic phenomena emerge within the asymptotic domains, but there is a discontinuity at each of its asymptotes since there the laws of arithmetic break down.

In physics, on the other hand, we find that the most famous theory pairs are all asymptotically related - e.g. (and roughly) Lim1/c → 0 (special relativity) → Newtonian mechanics, Limλ → 0(wave optics) → ray optics, Limh → 0 (quantum mechanics) → Newtonian mechanics, etc. In the last two cases the asymptotic domains are filled with interesting phenomena, like rainbows in wave optics. (However, as Batterman notes at p.78, exact retrieval of a predecessor theory in the asymptotic limit rarely happens, there are typically formulae on both sides that don’t ‘match up’ asymptotically; one of the best fits is the Special Relativity-Newtonian mechanics pair, one of the most uneven fits is the statistical mechanics-thermodynamics pair, cf. Hooker 1981, Part I.) More abstractly, consider a “more fundamental theory” Tf and its coarser predecessor Tc, with Limp →0 (Tf) = Tc, for appropriate p (1/c, λ, h, eTc.). There are three kinds of properties and relations, found in three separate domains, connected with this situation. In progression as p → 0, these are: the properties and relations of Tf in the non-asymptotic domain (p not small), those of the Tf asymptotic domain (p small), and those of Tc, the limit domain (p zero).

For the wave/ray optics example, the non-asymptotic domain is characterized by wave phenomena like diffraction and interference through superposition, the limit domain is characterized solely by linear rays, and the asymptotic domain by tiny wave patterns concentrated along curves constructed as the tangents to rays, called caustics. Here is the elegant Berry, a mathematical doyen of asymptotics, as quoted by Batterman (p.116):

The [asymptotic] patterns inhabit the borderland between the ray and wave theories, because when λ is zero the fringes are too small to see, whereas when λ is too large the overall structure of the pattern cannot be discerned: they are wave fringes decorating ray singularities.

This passage gives the sense of the caustic structure slowly becoming discernable, slowly emerging, from the interference patterns among waves as the wavelength decreases, until finally there is nothing left but the rays and their caustics.

These caustics are singularities in the wave pattern because, strictly, along them the wave intensity becomes infinite in the limit. Berry calls them “diffraction catastrophes” (a mathematical term) and says that they “constitute a hierarchy of nonanalyticities” (quoted at p.116). Cases like this last are referred to as singular asymptotics, while cases where there are no singularities are referred to as regular asymptotics. For regular asymptotics the limit goes smoothly and no new features emerge in the asymptotic domain - however the properties and relations of the limit (Tc) domain may still be markedly different from those of the fundamental theory (Tf) domain. This is well illustrated in the case of special relativity where, setting p = 1/c we observe that the non-Newtonian factor in relativity theory, 1 + v2(1/c)2, → 1 smoothly as 1/c → 0 (for finite v), yielding the Newtonian condition.

Asymptotic phenomena, whether in the asymptotic domain or the limit domain, have an interesting and important property: universality. All classic pendulums (light arms with heavier ‘bobs’ on the end) swinging through only an asymptotically small angle θ (θ → 0) perform simple harmonic oscillations, their oscillation frequency (f) determined solely by their arm length (l) and the common force of gravity (g, per unit mass), f = (g/l)1/2. This result applies no matter what they are made of, where they are swinging, and so on. This is why Batterman calls it a universal law and its realizations a universal phenomenon.

More generally, as p → 0 terms involving p grow small and may be neglected, vanishing in the limit, and in this process information about this parameter is systematically deleted or ‘thrown away’. Thus all p-differentiated laws will coincide yielding a law universally applicable across the erstwhile p-differentiated spectrum. For instance, all detailed non-linear dynamical state-sequence formulae for small-angle pendula movements will converge to the simple harmonic law, and the relativistic laws will converge to the Newtonian laws. But note, what Batterman does not, that not all demonstrations of irrelevance of information require asymptotics; e.g. the conclusion that energy is conserved, so all states lie on an iso-energetic sphere, immediately entails the irrelevance of all information to specifying trajectories but total energy and equality of initial momenta components.

Furthermore, as the relativity example of v2(1/c)2 suggests, all asymptotic processes generate dimensionless constants, viz. those reflecting the discarded aspects. In the case of the small-swing pendula, e.g., the key dimensionless constant is f(l/g)1/2. As this example shows, however, these constants need not refer to single basic physical dimensions. And while asymptotic phenomena may be captured by the right kind of dimensional analysis – in the simplest cases, like pendula, some simple assumptions and the requirement of dimensional consistency alone suffice to derive the universal law – in more complex cases a straightforward analysis may not be available (cf. p.16).

Though it is never quite made explicit, Batterman creates the presumption (with considerable plausibility) that the only way to obtain principled universal phenomena and laws is in this asymptotic manner. This raises two interesting, interrelated issues.

(A: Looking Back.) Since Newtonian mechanics is an asymptotic limit of relativistic mechanics, Newtonian mechanics systematically excludes certain information, viz. that concerning 1/c-dependent phenomena. This exclusion process is irreversible; there is no set of assumptions that can be added to Newtonian mechanics that will then deliver relativistic theory again. Contrast, e.g., the small-swing pendulum motion as an idealization of the more realistic non-linear motion, where adding the assumptions of non-negligible arm weight and angular displacement back into the same force analysis that produced the asymptotic law will restore the non-linear law. However, in the limit of 1/c → 0 the light cone edges collapse into the space axis thus irreversibly removing a key part of the structure of relativistic space-time and there is no set of assumptions that can be added to Newtonian space-time that will deliver relativistic space-time again. Hooker (1992, section IV) coined the term ‘degenerate idealization’ to refer to this irreversible relationship. Similarly, Newtonian mechanics is a degenerate idealization of quantum mechanics. It is a fact, as Batterman’s discussion shows, that the core history of modern physics is the successive revealing of then-best theories as in fact degenerate idealizations of still deeper theories (cf. also Hooker 1991, section VII). Something like this might perhaps also be claimed for the recent history of chemistry as well as first atomic theory then quantum theory have been worked through it. It is cognitively apparent why this progression might apply: we notice only the crudest features of a new domain at first and only later learn to refine and/or extend our examination techniques sufficiently to notice asymptotic-level discrepancies. If this line proves supportable, it offers a more systematic conception of the history of mature sciences than merely empirical improvement.

(B: Looking Forward.) What of relativistic and non-relativistic quantum theories in turn? Can they also be obtained as the asymptotic limit of some still more fundamental principle by ‘collapsing dimensions’? This is a perplexing and controversial issue - not least because Newton’s law are obtained as asymptotic limits of both of these theories and yet there is as yet no fully satisfactory way to unite them. Whether this explanatory regress ever terminates in a principled way lies behind the ideas of a categorical theory (Petersen 1968) and Batterman’s speculation that asymptotics is the proper and only explanation of universality. Again, Batterman does not discuss these issues, but they complement his account and deserve philosophical attention.

There is at least one further interesting feature shared by some universal phenomena in the asymptotic domain, self-similarity. In every case of so-called ‘critical phenomena’, e.g. near the ‘critical point’ beyond which there is no vapor phase between liquid and gas, the asymptotic domain shows a universally self-similar spectrum of fluctuations. (A pattern P is self-similar if there is a sub-scale on which P is repeated, and so on indefinitely.) This is indicative of chaos and occurs when behaviors are super-complexly, but still systematically, interrelated. However, clearly not all asymptotic phenomena are of this kind, as witness small-swing pendula. Whence, yet another conclusion not made explicit by Batterman, since some of the main methods of asymptotic analysis, e.g. the methods of intermediate asymptotics and the Renormalization Group, search explicitly for self-similar solutions, they are not suited to all asymptotic phenomena.

Thus while all asymptotic processes generate universal phenomena characterized by dimensionless constants (because what ensues is independent of the details captured in the discarded terms), and possibly all universal phenomena are generated as outcomes of asymptotic processes (that depends on the controversial issues canvassed above), not all asymptotic processes lead to self-similarity (chaos occurring only in rather special circumstances).

The preceding discussion has provided the opportunity to introduce the fascinating and subtle theoretical issues, rich beyond telling here, Batterman discusses clearly and carefully. But also, through the issues noted as undiscussed along the way, it permits making out a general desire that he had been just a little more explicit and systematic in his discussion. But that is all - whereas, by contrast, his philosophical theses will prove, I think, more controversial.

Batterman makes 3 primary and closely interrelated philosophical claims about asymptotics: (1) Asymptotic and causal explanation are quite distinct, basically because the latter requires all the dynamical detail to model specific situations whereas the former precisely focus on systematically deleting information to form explanations universal for some asymptotic domain. (2) Asymptotic analysis requires irreducible reference to the entities of the limit domains as well to those of the non-asymptotic domain, basically because the asymptotic pattern is one where the limit structure is emerging within the asymptotic domain, e.g. the wave optics asymptotic domain of tiny wave patterns concentrated along ray caustics, and so can only be described by referring to both kinds of entities. (3) Asymptotic patterns constitute a new form of emergence, which invalidates traditional treatments of reduction, basically because asymptotic properties do not arise from the properties and relations of the limit theory (Tc) at all but from those of the successor theory (Tf) itself yet, per (2), require reference to limit theory (Tc) entities to explain.

It is beyond the proper length and intention of a review journal to discuss these important theses much further here. Suffice it to say that the mere use of a term like “caustic”, even ‘essentially’, is no guide to ontology or explanatory requirement. It is also not possible to discuss a particular cloud formation as like a flying saucer, in explanation of reports of flying saucers, without using the term “flying saucer” and in the sense a UFOlogist would, but, as Plato noted, this had better not ontologically commit us to flying saucers or to their explanation (as opposed to their explaining away). Nonetheless, behind Batterman’s theses stand some deeply important issues both for philosophy of explanation and reduction/emergence and for understanding asymptotics, issues that will repay longer reflection and which Batterman rightly argues have been neglected by philosophy.

Minor Complaints

I found a few of Batterman’s diagrams too obscure to follow easily. Fig. 4.6, p.53, e.g., is there to illuminate a fluid flow example but contains no explanation or definition of the ti, j symbols (there, or in the text), the structuring of the dynamics around a “stationary point” r0 (that actually changes!) is left obscure, as are the choices of liquid incidence angles. Similarly, Fig. 4.3, p.41, the crucial piece in making the renormalization process intelligible, is left with virtually no interpretation and is quite opaque. A little more attention to (inexpert) reader information would have corrected these flaws. Similarly for a few poorly worded sentences: at p.19, l.21 the reference of “former” is obscure (it refers to limiting cases which are not singular); at p.23, l.6 from bottom the sense of “instance” in “explain an instance of universality” is ambiguous as between the detailed motion of a system, which would contradict the remainder of what is said, and a case of a universal law (evidently intended).

There is a frustrating use of scare quotes in crucial passages as a substitute for precision. Consider, e.g., “it is entirely reasonable to think of catastrophe optics as a genuinely new theory, a “third theory”, describing the asymptotic [domain]” (p.97), followed by “there is a genuine, distinct, third theory … that of necessity makes reference to both ray theoretic and wave theoretic structures in characterizing its “ontology” - then, since it is this ontology that we take to be emergent …”(p.119). Here all the key terms are scare-quoted, and inconsistently(!), so that it is difficult to know exactly what is really being claimed. I am completely in sympathy with Batterman’s desire to capture the life-of-its-own sense about the complex structures asymptotic analysis reveals, without having much sympathy for the use of terminology that is clearly not really appropriate dressed up in scare quotes to do the job.

Finally, equation 7.6, p.103, strictly needs K1/2 (not K) to square it with substituting 7.4 into 7.3, and at p.107, l.9 insert “space” after “phase”.


I agreed readily enough to review this book because I wanted to read Batterman on asymptotics. As an old physicist, I have long approved his philosophical attention to this neglected field and in the past enjoyed his clear and technically competent expositions. This book is interesting, substantial and rich. And though I have suggested that Batterman is less successful with his philosophical theses, this book provides an excellent presentation of asymptotics and is by far the best source for its philosophical discussion. Buy it and read it with pleasure.


Hooker, C.A. [1991], “Between Formalism and Anarchism: A Reasonable Middle Way” in Munevar, G. [ed.], Beyond Reason, Boston: Kluwer.

Hooker, C.A. [1992], “Idealization, Naturalism and Rationality: Some lessons from Minimal Rationality”, Synthese 99, 181-231.

Petersen, A. [1968], Quantum Physics and the Philosophical Tradition, Cambridge, Mass. : MIT Press.