The Dialectic of Essence: A Study of Plato's Metaphysics

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Silverman, Allan, The Dialectic of Essence: A Study of Plato's Metaphysics, Princeton University Press, 2002, 408pp, $24.95 (pbk), ISBN 069109179X.

Reviewed by Robert S. Colter , Centre College


In The Dialectic of Essence: A Study of Plato’s Metaphysics, Allan Silverman presents the reader with a remarkable synoptic treatment of Plato’s metaphysical philosophy. Silverman offers an interpretation that takes on most of the major points of contention among scholars such as central issues in the Theory of Forms, the relation of ontology and language and the notorious receptacle. I cannot explore all of the details of Silverman’s closely argued book, but I hope to give the reader some flavor of this important work.

Silverman’s work is located in the center of the Anglo-American, analytic tradition of Plato scholarship, a pedigree he openly acknowledges. His position in that tradition, as becomes clear in the course of the book, is not one of mere orthodoxy; many of his conclusions are original and quite controversial. He is a developmentalist who believes that Plato’s views developed over his rather long career, and he reads the dialogues as vehicles for Plato to express his own philosophical doctrines. He also accepts a fairly orthodox, within the tradition, chronology of the dialogues. None of these assumptions is universally held, and all have been called into question recently. Nevertheless, while Silverman is not blind to the assumptions he makes, he does make them without apology.

The book is divided into seven chapters, with an introduction, a conclusion and an appendix. In each of the seven main chapters, Silverman limits the scope of discussion to a specific set of issues, often within a particular dialogue, but sometimes to a group of dialogues or only a portion of one. The result is a rather clear development of the overall position that Silverman advocates. I hope to give some sense of this position as well as highlight some controversial points.

Chapter 1 begins with a more-or-less uncontroversial synopsis of platonic metaphysics. It has been accepted since at least Aristotle that for Plato the most basic beings are Forms, and that these Forms are in some sense “separate” from other entities, especially material particulars. It has also been a problem since antiquity how to understand this notion of separation, which is related to, or, according to Silverman, identical with the idea that the Forms are “themselves by themselves.” Silverman uses this notion as his starting point. There are (at least) three ways of looking at separation. One is the idea that Forms are separate ontologically from sensible material particulars. The second is that of the separation of beings that are “themselves by themselves” and beings that are the same as themselves. Silverman calls this the separation between Being and Identity. The third and final way is that there is a separation between the mind of the one who knows the object in question and the object of knowledge itself. Silverman then claims, “Plato’s metaphysics develops in tandem with his views on these three aspects of separation” (14). At the most basic level, however, the notion of separation depends on the fact that the Forms have a peculiar relationship to their essence, and have a very different relationship to material particulars. Silverman cashes out these relations by looking to the Phaedo, where Plato notoriously claims that “Beauty is beautiful.” This, of course, raises the notorious problem of self-predication. Silverman offers a solution that is a variant on the solution proposed by Alexander Nehamas: When one says that Beauty Is (Silverman’s capitalization) beautiful, or that any form F-ness Is F, what one really means is that Beauty (or F-ness) is what-it-is-to-be beautiful (or F). This is not to say, as others have, that in self-predication statements with a Form as the subject, a Form is identical with its essence, i.e., with what it is to be the Form it itself is. For Silverman, Being the thing the Form is is somehow prior to identity, for nothing can be either the same as itself or different from anything else unless it is the thing that it is. On the other hand, when one says that Helen is beautiful, one really means that Helen partakes in beauty. That is, Helen stands in a relation to Beauty that gives her the property of beauty. Thus, Being is not, for Silverman, a characterizing relation, whereas partaking is, and both are primitive relations.

Chapter 2 discusses the possibility that there are some metaphysical views in the “Socratic” or early dialogues. Silverman argues that there is no well worked out view to be found, at least until the Meno, which heralds the beginning of Plato’s theorizing about the nature of properties and definitions. In other early dialogues, according to Silverman, Socrates does not have a metaphysical “theory,” but does make use of what can be reasonably seen as points of metaphysical “doctrine.” That is, while no investigation is made into the ontological status of things such as Piety and Virtue, Socrates and his interlocutors do not hesitate to treat them as things with some legitimate ontological status.

Chapter 3 looks at some central parts of the Phaedo and Republic, in which Silverman sees the basic outline of the Theory of Forms. As Silverman acknowledges, there is much that is not developed in these dialogues, but some fundamental views are expressed. In particular, Silverman focuses on the introduction of the idea of the “forms-in-us” in the Phaedo. What is meant by this is the subject of a good deal of scholarly controversy. Silverman, calling them “form-copies,” defends them as legitimate items in Plato’s ontology. Silverman is certainly correct that the Phaedo makes use of these entities, but it is less clear that they appear in the Republic and later. As I understand it, Silverman’s most powerful argument for these items is not in this chapter, but occurs in the final chapter of the book, on which see below.

The first three chapters, then, lay a basic groundwork for the more difficult philosophizing that comes out of the next several chapters. For the rest of the book Silverman focuses on the later dialogues, Parmenides, Sophist, Philebus, and Timaeus. Most who are not Plato scholars, and many who are, tend to avoid these dialogues, which are notoriously difficult, dense, and confusing. In Silverman’s view, the true heart of Plato’s metaphysical theory lies in these dialogues, and thus it is not only justified, but necessary that these dialogues receive Silverman’s most careful attention.

Chapter 4, “Refining the Theory of Forms,” is a detailed study of certain aspects of the Parmenides. As Silverman puts it, “The Parmenides is both one kind of challenge to the Hypothesis of Forms and a response to the challenge” (105). The crux of the response to the challenge, according to Silverman’s interpretation, comes from the beginning of the passage known as the second Hypothesis (142b1-155e3), in which, Silverman claims, we come to understand more clearly the relation between a Form and its essence. If his earlier claim that this relation is the fundamental one for the notions of separation at play and indeed for Plato’s metaphysics in general, then his interpretation of this passage is absolutely crucial. The Second Hypothesis, according to Silverman, shows that Being and One-ness must partake of one another. That is, for something truly to Be, i.e., have an essence, it must exist as some one thing. On the other hand, for something to Be its essence, it must have that essence uniquely. Thus every Form is a “one-being,” which is to say that each Form partakes in both Being and One-ness in order to be the very same self-identical thing that it is. Another feature of the Forms that immediately becomes clear is that they cannot be isolated from one another, but must be inter-related, at least logically, and so the Forms have properties.

The final three chapters contain what are, in my view, Silverman’s most interesting and controversial arguments. Chapters 5 and 6 are focused on the Sophist. Chapter 5, “Forms and Language” centers on the famous communion of Forms and the five “greatest kinds.” Given Silverman’s explanation of the result of the Parmenides that the Forms must have properties of some sort, Plato the metaphysician must further explain the relations between the Forms. Thus, the Sophist continues a project begun in the Parmenides, one that further distances the theorizing of the Sophist from the picture we get in the Phaedo, for example. Silverman argues powerfully against the view, first championed by Gilbert Ryle, that Plato abandons substantial Forms in the Sophist, and that the “kinds” are merely “syncategorematic judgments.” The most important and most difficult part of his argument is to show that the Forms participate, which seemed to be required for the solution to succeed. Silverman explains that, for Plato, to participate in Being is to become a legitimate object, that is a Form. Thus, to “Be” is to become “essenced” (180).

Chapter 6 focuses on the problem of “not-being,” as it is developed in the Sophist. The discussion is divided into two major parts. The first is on the relation between not-being and Difference, and the parts thereof. The second concerns the role of the method of collection and division in the investigation of not-beings. Silverman argues that Plato begins in this dialogue to recognize that there is a difference between the ontological and conceptual orders. In particular, one result of the use of collection and division is that there are concepts, i.e., contents of our thoughts, that do not have corresponding Forms. Silverman also spends several pages arguing against the view, which he calls a “new orthodoxy,” (210) that the method of collection and division shows that Plato is now endorsing some form of coherentism according to which no Form can be known in isolation, but must be considered in the light of the conceptual structure and interrelations exhibited by collection and division in order to be known. While Silverman raises a number of important criticisms of this view, such as the point that such a coherentism seems to require that one know everything in order to know anything, he does not address what seems to me the most compelling evidence for this “new orthodoxy.” That evidence comes from the “dream” passage of the Theaetetus, and seems to conclude that nothing can be known in isolation. Exactly how to interpret the “dream” passage is controversial, but one way to understand it is as an argument showing that non-discursive knowledge cannot succeed, because all knowledge requires the ability to give an account. On many interpretations, this is taken to be the main point of the Theaetetus as a whole. Many of the accounts canvassed in the Theaetetus are of an inter-relating sort, and this suggests to many a form of coherentism or holism. Silverman seems to recognize a tension here, saying that it “points to the irreducible and ineliminable gap between the discursive and intuitive accounts of knowledge in Plato” (216). I would like to see more argument than Silverman provides to establish that the gap is in fact as he describes. Of course, I recognize that such a discussion would go beyond the immediate scope of Silverman’s project, but I find his argument on this point uncompelling without consideration of the argument of the Theaetetus.

Chapter 7, “The Nature of Material Particulars,” explores the nature of these lesser objects in Plato’s ontology as it is developed in the Philebus and Timaeus. As Silverman notes, this has not been a topic that scholars have chosen to pursue, and thus his contribution constitutes the longest and perhaps most difficult chapter of the book. Silverman argues that material particulars become a more important part of Plato’s metaphysical thinking than they are in earlier dialogues, and that Plato’s treatment of them in the Philebus and Timaeus is a sort of “rehabilitation” of them (219). One result of this is that material particulars become respectable objects of cognition and of the method of collection and division in particular.

I cannot possibly do justice to Silverman’s extensive argument in this chapter, but his conclusions are roughly as follows, as I understand them. Material particulars are, in the end, the composites that result from the interaction of the receptacle, which is a completely natureless medium, and the form-copies that are the properties of the particulars. Thus, it is still the case that, for Plato, particulars are dependent entities, since those form-copies are themselves dependent on the Forms. What then is the receptacle? One way to understand it is as matter, and so to understand a particular as a composite of matter and properties, as Aristotle does. But this is not Plato’s position, according to Silverman. Matter itself is a construct. Recall that the receptacle is utterly natureless and has no properties whatsoever. But matter has the properties of extension and place. These properties, according to Silverman’s Plato, are the result of the interaction of the receptacle with the geometrical form-copies that are so prominent in the Timaeus. Thus, it is this understanding of material particulars that constitutes Silverman’s best argument for form-copies, namely that without them, no coherent account of material particulars could be given.

In sum, Silverman has produced an important contribution to contemporary scholarship on Plato’s metaphysics. While one might find certain details of his account less than convincing when taken in isolation, the coherence and detail of his overall interpretation make a compelling case. But beyond that, Silverman has also made a compelling case for Plato the metaphysician and that his metaphysical thinking should play more of a role in contemporary discussions of these issues than it has. On Silverman’s interpretation, Plato’s metaphysical philosophy, especially in the later dialogues such as Sophist, Philebus, and Timaeus, is as philosophically respectable as any competitor today, and any student of issues surrounding universals and particulars would be well served to spend more time studying it.