The Dialectical Method: A Treatise Hegel Never Wrote

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Clark Butler, The Dialectical Method: A Treatise Hegel Never Wrote, Humanity Books, 2011, 276pp., $39.00 (pbk), ISBN 9781616144890.

Reviewed by Karen Ng, Siena College


As is now widely acknowledged, English language scholarship on Hegel has thrived for at least the past thirty years, and interest in the Science of Logic in particular has continued to grow. The renewed interest in Hegel (though arguably there is not a major philosophical movement in the 19th or 20th century that does not stand in some relation to Hegel) has prompted scholars to continually find new ways of putting his often impenetrable texts in conversation with contemporary philosophy, a task that is undoubtedly necessary, but not without its potential difficulties. Clark Butler's new book is an ambitious attempt at rendering Hegel's infamous dialectical logic both respectable and useful for the philosophical present. In what follows, I will first briefly outline the contents of Butler's book, and then assess four theses that he defends.

The book is divided into three parts, proceeding in a roughly chronological order. Part One explores historical precursors of Hegel's dialectical method in ancient Greek thought. Here, Butler emphasizes the influence of three figures in particular: Pythagoras, Sophocles, and Zeno. In Pythagoras, Butler finds the "historical root of speculative philosophy," where speculative philosophy consists in the "oneness of the individual human soul and the cosmos" (19, 20). From Sophocles, Butler aims to uncover a poetic root of the idea of dialectic through a tragic causality of fate, drawing primarily from Hegel's early theological writings. In Zeno, Butler finds the origin of dialectical logic itself, and in particular, the method of indirect proof.

After this assessment of the historical origins of the dialectical method, Part Two explores the dialectical method in Hegel's own texts and attempts to reconstruct his method in relation to contemporary formal logic. Here, Butler swiftly takes up two colossal yet ultimately misguided tasks. The first is to formalize and translate Hegel's method into the language of contemporary formal logic. The second is to translate this same method into what Butler calls a dialectical-hermeneutic method, one that will allow him, in Part Three, to use Hegel's method to develop a naively theological understanding of world history. In the last part of the book, Butler somewhat clumsily applies what he takes to be Hegel's method to three specific "post-Hegelian historical situations" in order to explore possible developments of the dialectical method after Hegel (167): The American Counterculture (roughly, post-World War II America from the 1950s onward), Freudian psychoanalysis, and historical materialism. Any single one of these tasks (retracing the historical origins of the dialectical method, assessing the plausibility of translating Hegel's logic into formal logic, assessing the "applicability" of Hegel's method to the interpretation of history, or understanding the specific relevance of Hegel's method in connection with psychoanalysis, Marxism, or human rights -- the latter being a research interest of Butler's and a recurrent theme throughout all of the discussions in his book) could easily form its own book length project. To attempt all of them in one book gives the impression of a certain indiscretion, and more importantly, it is difficult to see how any one strand of thinking fits essentially with any other. (What does psychoanalysis have to do with formal logic? How does the formalization of Hegel's logic contribute to an interpretation of world history? Is a theological reading of the absolute compatible with Marx? If there is an essential connection between these disparate strands of thinking, Butler does not make it explicit.). Additionally, all of these sweeping suggestions are filtered through the lens of a highly anachronistic reading of Hegel, one that requires a justification that Butler does not provide.

Butler defends roughly four main theses in his book, most of which are familiar from his earlier work on Hegel.[1] The first thesis is the historical one concerning the ancient Greek origins of Hegel's dialectical method in Pythagoras, Sophocles, and Zeno. The strongest evidence for the significance of Pythagoras (here understood as Pythagorean philosophy) and Zeno can perhaps be found in Hegel's Lectures on the History of Philosophy, although Hegel's assessments here are characteristically ambivalent (I leave Sophocles out of this discussion -- the topic of Hegel and tragedy surely warrants a much more detailed treatment than I can provide here). Butler makes the rather strong claim that "the Pythagoras of legend, is the principal historical source of Hegel's idea of speculative philosophy," but also recognizes that Hegel in fact "gives meager recognition of this source" (19). The idea of speculative philosophy as defined by Butler consists in an absolute unity or oneness of a microcosm and its macrocosm, paradigmatically, an individual and the cosmos or "world soul" (20). While the historical question is certainly open to dispute, Butler's philosophical understanding of the meaning of "speculative" philosophy for Hegel is rather conjectural and operates at such a high level of generality that the connection to Pythagorean philosophy at times seems arbitrary. Even if the historical thesis could be defended, it is difficult to see from Butler's discussion exactly how this connection to a highly obscure figure of antiquity sheds light on an already obscure philosophy.

The case for the influence of Zeno is supported by Hegel's suggestion that "the dialectic . . . properly begins with him."[2] Much of Butler's account here hinges on the significance of indirect proof or proof by contradiction for Hegel's dialectical method, a form of argumentation many scholars believe originated with Zeno. On the one hand, Butler suggests that indirect proof is "first applied un-self-consciously in the original self-constructions of human history," claiming that we do not use indirect proof but that it "deploys us as the unwitting vehicles of its own advance" (52, 59). On the other hand, indirect proof is "then self-consciously [applied] in the hermeneutic reconstruction of such historical constructions" (52). The former, crudely realist interpretation of method is suggested throughout by Butler, usually through vague allusions to complex historical events (the Holocaust, the emergence of human rights) and psychoanalytic concepts (the oceanic feeling, primary narcissism, omnipotence) as "proof" of the independent reality of method, but not explicitly argued for. The claim that the method that "deploys us" can itself be self-consciously deployed by us is taken up in the remainder of the book.

Butler's second thesis concerns the formalization of Hegel's dialectical logic, namely, that Hegel's method can indeed be productively translated into modern formal logic. His strategy hinges on suggesting that "standard dialectical logic [i.e., Hegel's] was only a special use of formal logic by certain variations on indirect proof" (13). Butler specifies six rules of what he calls deductive dialectical logic: i) Abstraction of Determinations; ii) Absolutizations; iii) Abstraction/Positing of the Other; iv) Negation of the Other; v) Self-Negation; and vi) Negation of Negation. Each rule is symbolized in terms of quantification logic and corresponds roughly to the process through which the infamous Hegelian dialectic or determinate negation is carried out. On the issue of Butler's attempt at formalization, one can raise two questions, both of which have been previously posed by J.N. Findlay in his comment on Butler's earlier attempt to formalize Hegel's logic.[3] First, even if Butler has accurately translated Hegel's method into the terms of formal logic (Findlay raises some doubts as to whether or not this has been achieved), Butler's account "makes indirect proof obligatory whereas in other systems it is optional."[4] That is, even if we accept that Hegel's method is indeed a variation on indirect proof, why is indirect proof the preferred or even only philosophical method available to us in the investigation of any problem? The second question concerns whether or not indirect proof in fact adequately captures Hegel's distinct and rather complex conceptions of identity, difference, negation, contradiction, and reconciliation, particularly when we turn to examples of the dialectic at work in Hegel's text.[5] What Hegel means by negation simply cannot be captured by negation in the formal logical sense. As Findlay aptly notes, "symbolization is worthwhile only if it mechanizes, if it works automatically once one starts it going. Mr. Butler's symbolization does not."[6] In other words, insofar as further interpretation and rational reconstruction is always required, symbolization "does not illuminate it, but only gives one a headache."[7]

From the formalization of method, Butler continues to his third thesis that the dialectical method can also be a hermeneutic method, specifically, that it can be used for the "self-reconstruction of the present" (131). Butler aims to demonstrate that the dialectical method is both embedded in and "has unfolded in world history" (138). Once we have a firm grasp of method, we can understand how world history has developed according to dialectical logic, a logic embodied in concrete historical events. Roughly, Butler suggests that the three books of Hegel's Science of Logic (The Doctrine of Being, The Doctrine of Essence, and The Doctrine of the Concept (der Begriff), which Butler inexplicably translates as "self-concept") provides the "rational theology" for three stages of world history: primitive pantheism, theism, and universal freedom (155-63). Butler's theological understanding of a dialectical logic embedded in world history is tied to his theological reading of the absolute. He writes: "since 'the absolute' is a technical code word for God, dialectical logic also unfolds in rational theology, testing different assumptions about what God in particular is" (78). It is difficult to assess Butler's thesis here, not only because it strays far from Hegel's texts, but because it is unclear how his thesis could be either proven or disproven. Adding to an already overburdened thought, Butler further suggests that the logical-historical-theological unfolding of the absolute is equally an unfolding of "infinite power and goodness," a "vital belief" for all human beings (66, 70). Such highly abstract remarks simply invite the thought that Hegel was indeed the excessive philosopher that many have deemed him to be, a historical curiosity of no contemporary significance.

Butler's fourth and final thesis consists in the claim that a theological dialectical logic unfolding in history can in fact be "proven" by turning to events in world history and intellectual history: post-WWII America, Freudian psychoanalysis (although psychoanalytic references are present throughout the entire book), and dialectical materialism. Butler explores post-WWII America under the heading of "The American Counterculture" (also the title of Chapter Eight), which refers to various countercultural movements in the last half of the 20th century fighting against the "prevailing corporate culture of the 1950s" (168). Butler includes in this group the Beatniks, the hippie movement, the yippie movement, and the Jesus movement (169). According to Butler, we can understand these various cultural movements as embodiments of the dialectic found in the "Reason" chapter of Hegel's Phenomenology of Spirit.[8] Butler suggests that the new left critique begins as Hegel's standpoint of observation, that hippies exemplify his standpoint of pleasure and necessity, yippies his law of the heart, the Jesus people his virtue and the way of the world, and the commercialization of counterculture his spiritual animal kingdom. Complex concepts of Freudian psychoanalysis are represented through the dialectic of consciousness and self-consciousness in Hegel's Phenomenology, and a dubious connection is drawn between the method of free association and the dialectical method.[9] The psychosexual development of the child is read directly into the progression from sense-certainty, perception, force and understanding, the inverted world, self-consciousness, the life and death struggle, and finally, the unhappy consciousness (193­-206).

In his discussion of the third "use" of dialectical method in historical materialism, Butler addresses the question of whether the dialectical method as the rational theological reconstruction of the unfolding of absolute freedom and goodness in history -- a thought he associates throughout his book with the emergence of universal human rights -- is indeed falsifiable (221ff.). Butler takes up a phenomenon that can be viewed as a possible refutation of his interpretation of method, namely, the existence and persistence of global poverty, the problem of the Pöbelfamiliar from Hegel's Philosophy of Right. It would seem that the existence of poverty contradicts Butler's suggestion throughout that the dialectical method can be used to understand the emergence of absolute freedom and goodness in history, even while he endorses that we can have "trust" in the latter largely due to the "post-1789 global human rights movement and revolution" (73, 72). In the end, Butler remains ambivalent but optimistic, citing South Africa, the Arab Spring, and Occupy Wall Street as examples of "mass resistance to domination" that can renew our trust in the absolute (232).

I will conclude with a few general remarks about Butler's book as a whole. First, it is difficult to know what the intended audience for this book is. Butler's discussions are far too abstruse for students aiming to understand Hegel's difficult texts, but neither does it contribute to any contemporary debate in the scholarship on the question of Hegel's method. Secondly, Butler simply attempts to do far too much in one book, and as a consequence, fails to treat the extremely complex issues at stake with adequate care. While the topics are surely worthy of attention -- Hegel's historical sources, the status of Hegel's logic in connection with contemporary formal logic, how Hegel's philosophy can help us understand the present -- it is difficult to see how the dispersed and swiftly presented arguments all fit together. Finally, while I do in fact think that Hegel's philosophy continues to be of immense value for our self-understanding -- for example, in contemporary Critical Theory -- Butler's book also alerts us to the potential danger of simply reading philosophical arguments that we want to endorse into history ("Since Freud by all accounts never read Hegel, any discovery of dialectical logic embedded in such [psychosexual] development would give independent confirmation of the presence of such dialectic in the world" (187)). To be sure, Hegel himself could have been guilty of this. Nonetheless, this is surely something that philosophers should aim to avoid.

[1] See for example Clark Butler, Hegel's Logic: Between Dialectic and History (Evanston, IL: Northwestern University Press, 1996); and "Hegel's Dialectic of the Organic Whole as a Particular Application of Formal Logic," in Art and Logic in Hegel's Philosophy, ed. Warren E. Steinkraus and Kenneth L. Schmitz (Atlantic Highlands, NJ: Humanities Press, 1980), pp. 219-32.

[2] Hegel, Lectures on the History of Philosophy, Volume 1: Greek Philosophy to Plato, trans. E.S. Haldane (Lincoln: University of Nebraska Press, 1995), p. 261. For an excellent account of Hegel's treatment of Zeno's paradox, see Allegra de Laurentiis, "'And Yet It Moves': Hegel on Zeno's Arrow," The Journal of Speculative Philosophy 9:4 (1995), pp. 256­-78.

[3] J.N. Findlay, "Comment [on "Hegel's Dialectic of the Organic Whole as a Particular Application of Formal Logic"]," in Art and Logic in Hegel's Philosophy, pp. 233-37.

[4] Ibid., p. 235.

[5] See ibid. pp. 235­­ -- 36.

[6] Ibid., p. 237.

[7] Ibid.

[8] See Hegel, Phenomenology of Spirit, trans. A.V. Miller (Oxford: Oxford University Press, 1977), pp. 139-235.

[9] Butler has given a more thorough account of the relation between Hegel and Freud in his article, "Hegel and Freud: A Comparison," Philosophy and Phenomenological Research 36:4 (1976), pp. 506-22.