The Dimensions of Consequentialism: Ethics, Equality and Risk

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Martin Peterson, The Dimensions of Consequentialism: Ethics, Equality and Risk, Cambridge University Press, 2013, 217pp., $90.00 (hbk), ISBN 9781107033030.

Reviewed by Michael Cholbi, California State Polytechnic University, Pomona


Consequentialist moral theory is contemporary philosophy's hydra. Just as one version of consequentialism is articulated and then criticized, more versions are generated in its stead. And if this proliferation of consequentialisms is not enough, now some consequentialists are bent on colonizing non-consequentialist territory, wielding the argument that every moral conception ultimately succumbs to the pressure to "consequentialize".[1]

I thus greeted Martin Peterson's Dimensions of Consequentialism with a certain wariness, wondering whether moral philosophy stands to benefit from yet another iteration of the consequentialist program. As it turns out, my wariness was misplaced. Peterson's "multi-dimensional consequentialism" represents a bona fide alternative to its "one-dimensional" rivals, and readers should admire his willingness to question prevalent consequentialist orthodoxies. In the end, Peterson's version of consequentialism confronts foundational challenges, but it is a theory that both consequentialists and their critics should take seriously.

1. Multidimensional Consequentialism

Peterson's multi-dimensional consequentialism (MDC) consists of three claims, which he defends primarily in chapters 1-2.

C1.The deontic status of an act depends on several irreducible moral aspects.

C2. The binary relation 'at least as good consequences as' is not a complete ordering.

C3. Moral rightness and wrongness are non-binary entities, meaning that moral rightness and wrongness vary in degrees. (This is approximately equivalent to the claim Peterson dubs Degree, that "all-things-considered deontic verdicts are, in many cases, only partial (i.e., hold to a limited degree.))" (26)

I will comment on each of these claims in turn.

C1 should not be confused with a pluralistic consequentialism according to which several moral aspects of an act (well-being, equality, etc.) contribute to its deontic status. C1 does not just deny that there is a single "super-value" determining acts' moral status. It asserts that right and wrong are a function of several aspects of an act that do not admit of a "principal ranking." (6-7)

According to C2, it is sometimes false that, when comparing two acts, one of the acts has at least as good consequences as the other. For instance, if two acts are such that the first ranks better than the second with respect to well-being but the second ranks better than the first with respect to equality, then there is not "an a priori reason" to suppose that these two acts can be ordered so as to capture "everything that we intuitively feel to be morally relevant." (10) Though Peterson does not argue in precisely this way, I take C2 to be more fundamental than C1 because C2, in combination with the claim Peterson takes to be definitive of consequentialism:

C*. The deontic status of an act depends only on consequences

seems to imply C1.

One might ordinarily conclude that C*, C1, and C2 imply a skeptical conclusion about consequentialism's prospects for guiding action. For supposing value pluralism is true, then these three claims suggest that often there is no one answer to "what, morally speaking, ought I do?" Peterson's C3 seems to permit the pluralistic consequentialist to evade such practical skepticism. In chapter 6, Peterson proposes that when two moral aspects clash, then an act is morally rational if the right kind of "fittingness-relation obtains between the deontic properties of the act and the decision maker's choice behaviour." (115) We give the various right-making features of alternative acts their due when we randomize our performance of alternative acts based on the amount of "moral force" each act has. An act's moral force is the product of its degree of rightness and its "strength", that is, the amount of value at stake. Two acts can thus be right to the same degree, including being entirely right, despite having different strengths (e.g., saving two will, all other things being equal, have twice the strength of saving one, even if saving one is, in some circumstances, entirely right).

Peterson's middle chapters meticulously develop a version of MDC resting on three values: persons, equality, and risk. Chapter 7 aims to show that even the best one-dimensional theory does not account for our moral intuitions as well as MDC does. Peterson's final chapter considers whether MDC enables non-consequentialist theories to be consequentialized. Peterson provides an appendix outlining a deontic logic that rejects a central assumption of Standard Deontic Logic, that deontic predicates are binary.

Because I find the general idea of MDC provocative, I would have preferred Peterson pay more attention to the arguments motivating MDC and to its intriguing practical implications than to developing his specific version of MDC. Still, readers of both consequentialist and non-consequentialist persuasions will find Peterson's book rewarding. He uses his extensive knowledge of consequentialism and rational choice theory to defend MDC, and in my estimation, succeeds in suggesting that it represents a genuinely overlooked position in moral philosophy, one with distinctive attractions. What I found most refreshing was Peterson's skepticism about the comparability or commensurability of values and his willingness to pursue the implications of this skepticism. Too often in consequentialist writings confident appeals are made to rankings of outcomes that incorporate multiple values. Peterson bravely considers how consequentialism would need to be developed if such confidence turns out to be misplaced.

The book raises far too many issues for me to engage more than a handful here. So I will raise objections to one strain of Peterson's argument for C3 and then highlight some of the challenges Peterson faces in making right and wrong a matter of degree.

2. Deontic Leaps

Central to Peterson's case for C3 is that the "standard view", according to which acts are "always either entirely right or entirely wrong" (25), is committed to "unwarranted deontic leaps" in the determination of acts' deontic statuses. (26) A deontic leap is analogous to the epistemic leap that underlies Kyburg's lottery paradox[2]: In a 10,000-ticket lottery with exactly one winning ticket, it is rational to believe that some ticket will win, although the very low probability (0.0001) that any particular ticket will win seems to entail that it is rational to believe that no ticket will win (ticket 1 will not win given its low probability, ticket 2 will not win given its low probability, etc.). As Peterson diagnoses matters, the latter claim amounts to an unwarranted "epistemic leap," from the warranted belief that that ticket i has a 0.0001 probability of winning to the unwarranted belief that i has a 0 probability of winning.

Peterson applies this lesson to the problems generated by clashes between different morally relevant aspects of a situation. On one version of the standard view, Resolution, clashes between conflicting aspects can be resolved so that there is at least one act that is all-things-considered permissible or, a fortiori, obligatory. On the other version of the standard view, Dilemma, these clashes are sometimes irresoluble, so that there may be multiple obligatory acts. Peterson argues that both Resolution and Dilemma should be rejected because neither version reflects the totality of morally relevant considerations that bear on acts' deontic status. They "leap" beyond what those considerations entail and assign deontic statuses to acts that do "not fully correspond to the underlying moral properties that obtain in the situation at hand." (26) In the case of Resolution, Peterson complains that it will invariably assign a verdictive role to one consideration, allowing it to take precedence over other evidentially relevant considerations. Resolution thus assigns some aspect too little weight in the determination of deontic status, much in the way that believing that some ticket m (rather than n) in the lottery will win discounts the evidence in favor of n's winning. In, for example, a situation with a conflict between well-being and equality, Resolution necessitates acting to realize either well-being or equality, with the aspect not acted upon ultimately playing no role in the determination of deontic status. With respect to Dilemma, Peterson contends that this view gives too much weight to some considerations. Again appealing to the lottery paradox, to conclude that multiple acts are obligatory is analogous to concluding that because the evidence that ticket i will win is as strong as the evidence that ticket j will win, then one is just as warranted in believing that i will win as one is warranted in believing that i and j will win. In a conflict between well-being and equality, Dilemma seems to turn each of these into verdictive, rather than merely evidential, considerations. Peterson thus concludes that both versions of the standard view make unwarranted deontic leaps, whereas his MDC, by adopting a non-binary conception of right and wrong, allows all the relevant considerations to "remain visible in the final analysis." (29)

I suspect, however, that proponents of either version of the standard view may reasonably complain that their positions manage to keep all morally relevant considerations "visible" in the way Peterson seems to have in mind without making illicit deontic leaps. Proponents of Dilemma may point out that the analogy to the lottery paradox is misleading: Peterson stipulates that the lottery has a single winning ticket, but how can we be confident that every moral situation has a single 'winning' act? Peterson concedes that his non-binary conception of moral status is compatible with the existence of genuine moral dilemmas (31), and the fact that multiple considerations appear verdictive looks like a good reason to think that some moral situations are epistemic dead heats. If so, then Dilemma makes no deontic leaps. For even though we cannot honor each verdictive consideration in practice, that cannot be equated with not honoring the evidence grounded in each consideration. The world simply conspires to make it impossible to act on both bodies of moral evidence.

For their part, proponents of Resolution may concede that in situations with moral aspects that generate conflicting deontic statuses for alternative acts, their view does entail that "some verdictive reason take[s] precedence over others" but deny that this entails "simply disregarding the other." (30) As W. D. Ross argued, cases of moral conflict often generate subsequent obligations that respond to the very considerations that were set aside as not verdictive in the conflict situation. In breaking my promise my Stella in order to confer a large benefit on Trudy, I incur duties of apology and reparation to Stella. Of course, there is a sense in which my promise to Stella does not "remain visible" when I instead confer a large benefit on Trudy, but in a conscientious agent, the promise breaking remains relevant to what I subsequently do. But advocates of Resolution may contend that Peterson treats acts in moral isolation from one another and thus misses how their view need not make groundless deontic leaps.

Peterson also offers other positive arguments for Degree besides this "deontic leaps" argument, but those attracted to versions of the "standard view" may find themselves untroubled by Peterson's critique of those conceptions.

3. Scalar and Binary Moral Conceptions

Traditional consequentialism grounds a binary conception of deontic status on a scalar conception of value. Norcross' scalar consequentialism accepts a similar scalar conception of value, but jettisons deontic status altogether. Peterson's MDC combines a scalar conception of deontic status and a multivariate scalar conception of value to explain what we ought to do. Is this a coherent way of modeling the relation between the deontic and the axiological?

Here is one reason to worry. Peterson's distinction between Degree and Strength is a valuable one. Life is littered with small obligations, acts right to a high degree but where little value is at stake. But some obligations seem more weighty even if they are not, in context, 'more right' than these small obligations. Yet the role of Degree in determining overall moral force, and therefore, in determining what it is rational for us to do, seems minor in comparison to Strength. Consider this situation:

Aaron is walking along an oceanside pier when he notices a crying child who has dropped her ice cream cone on the sidewalk. Aaron considers whether to stop and console the child. However, if Aaron does not stop to console the child, then he will notice two struggling swimmers, A and B, each of whom he could save with about the same amount of effort. But Aaron will not be able to save A and B.

It seems right to a high degree for Aaron to stop and console the child. But the strength (in Peterson's sense) of that obligation pales in comparison to the value at stake in saving one of A or B. Presumably, ceteris paribus, saving A has the same degree of rightness as saving B. I imagine most everyone, regardless of their sympathies for consequentialism, would conclude that it would be right (or most rational, or most morally defensible) for Aaron to save one of A or B and not console the crying child. This is so despite the fact that his obligation to save either A or B from drowning is not right (in its context) to as high a degree as his consoling the child is right (in its context).

This example illustrates that it looks as if, of the two factors that contribute to moral force, Strength plays by far the leading role. The scalar notion of strength matters much more to what it is rational (and moral) for us to do than the scalar notion of degree. If so, then MDC looks to be closer to standard versions of consequentialism than Peterson suggests. We should, according to MDC, do what has the most force, but that notion seems to be dominated by strength, i.e., by what has the most value. MDC thus seems pushed in the direction of holding, as Parfit puts it, that "whether our acts are right or wrong depends only on facts about how it would be best for things to go."[3] This would not show that C1 or C2 are incorrect. Peterson could continue to maintain that there is not always some unambiguous fact of the matter "about how it would be best for things to go" that does justice to all relevant values. But it does suggest that C3 may not be all that essential to MDC's explanation of right and wrong.

[1] Douglas Portmore, "Consequentializing moral theories," Pacific Philosophical Quarterly 88 (2007): 39-73.

[2]  Henry E. Kyburg, Probability and the Logic of Rational Belief, (Middletown, CT: Wesleyan University Press, 1961).

[3] Derek Parfit, On What Matters, v. 1 (Oxford: Oxford University Press, 2011), p. 302.