The Dimensions of Hegel's Dialectic

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Nectarios G. Limnatis (ed.), The Dimensions of Hegel's Dialectic, Continuum, 2010, 276pp., $120.00 (hbk), ISBN 9781441109552.

Reviewed by Michael Morris, University of South Florida


In an apt description of the guiding purpose, intended audience, and intellectual context for this collection of essays, editor Nectarios G. Limnatis notes that, "despite the immense and steadily growing Hegel discussion, dialectic is not frequently addressed in a systematic and comprehensive way in the English speaking world" (3). Accordingly, this volume brings together a roughly equal number of contributions from European and American scholars, with the intention of fostering English-language discussion of this central but abstruse Hegelian topic. While some contributions directly connect this topic with recent trends in contemporary Anglophone philosophy, including themes from the works of Wilfred Sellars, Robert Brandom, and John McDowell, other essays situate Hegel's dialectic within more exotic traditions, including negative theology and Heideggerian discussions of onto-theology. Additionally, many essays provide helpful historical context, focusing on the relationship between Hegel's dialectic and various related themes in the works of Kant, Fichte, Hölderlin, Schelling, Reinhold, and Novalis.

This book implicitly raises an important question, one that highlights the significance of the essays it contains, while, at the same time, suggesting some specific challenges these essays must address. Limnatis's pointed observation raises the question: why has the dialectic received so little attention from Anglophone philosophers, particularly those steeped in the analytic tradition?

In part, the answer lies in the history of analytic philosophy itself. If we ignore the role played by distinctly continental traditions in the formation of analytic philosophy, including the work of Frege and the logical positivism of the Vienna Circle, then we might say that analytic philosophy emerged from Russell and Moore's rejection of the British Hegelianism of their elders, the philosophical systems of F.H. Bradley and John McTaggart. Among other things, this involved the rejection of holism, the embrace of realism, and the insistence upon the role of formal systems and linguistic analysis as the primary means for resolving traditional philosophical problems. At least since Quine's "Two Dogmas," however, various kinds of holism have enjoyed a resurgence, and the dominance of rigidly formal, logical, and linguistic approaches to philosophical problems has greatly declined. Moreover, historical scholarship has suggested significant differences between Berkeley's idealism, with its Cartesian starting point, and the more complex and nuanced idealisms of Kant and Hegel, thus correcting certain simplistic conceptions of idealism that can be found in Bradley, McTaggert, and their detractors. Finally, the recent works of McDowell, and the reemergence of certain strands of pragmatism, as represented in the works of Sellars, Rorty, and Brandom, have suggested potential connections between contemporary concerns and the themes of Hegelian philosophy.

However, even if holism, idealism, and non-formal approaches to philosophy now enjoy a more prominent place in the Anglophone world, there remains a potential stumbling block at the heart of Hegel's philosophy: namely, the dialectic, along with Hegel's peculiar conception of the role that contradiction plays within thought and within the very structures of reality itself. It is clear, of course, that contradiction plays an important role in philosophical thought. Insofar as logical coherence provides a necessary -- if not sufficient -- condition for a true philosophical system, philosophical progress often involves both the discovery of latent contradictions within our pre-philosophical assumptions as well as the evaluation of various suggestions for removing these contradictions. If dialectic simply involved the discovery of contradiction within one system of thought and the development of a successor system that eliminates these contradictions, then it would be wholly unobjectionable. However, as many authors in this collection rightly emphasize, contradiction plays a far more complex role in Hegel's dialectic. On the traditional view of philosophical progress already presented, contradictions play a purely negative and ultimately contingent role. Their role is negative, for they merely indicate that we hold some false belief(s). Likewise, their role is contingent, for thought could, in principle, exist without them.

By contrast, contradiction plays a positive and essential role in Hegel's conception of thought, a role that apparently reflects the existence of contradictions in the basic structure of reality itself. Hegel's texts are filled with remarks like the following: "a consideration of everything that is shows that in its own self everything is in its self-sameness different from itself and self-contradictory."[1] Any serious interpretation of Hegel's texts must grapple with repeated claims of this sort. As one contributor to this volume, Dieter Wandschneider, pointedly notes: "Hegel's objective-idealistic program is so closely tied to the possibility of dialectical logic that the program itself stands or falls thereon" (31). Dialectic is not an optional feature of Hegel's philosophy, one we might safely ignore or excise.

In relation to this perplexing topic, we can approach the essays in this volume in terms of three different questions. First, what leads Hegel to make contradiction a central theme in his philosophy? Second, what aspects or interpretations of the dialectic might allow us to avoid the unsettling conclusion that Hegel's philosophy flagrantly violates the principle of non-contradiction? Third, what does Hegel actually mean when he presents contradiction as an essential feature of thought and reality?

Two of the more interesting and helpful explanations for Hegel's interest in contradiction and dialectic come from the contributions of Klaus Düsing and Dieter Heidemann, both of whom locate the roots of the dialectic in Hegel's early theological concerns. Like the friends of his youth, Schelling and Hölderlin, the young Hegel engaged in heterodox speculations about the ultimate but imminent unity of reality, about a pantheistic and non-personal god in the tradition of Spinoza. Discursive thought divides and distinguishes, and thus it cannot grasp a unity that is absolute and unconditioned. In its attempts to do so, discursive thought inevitably breaks down, becomes embroiled in contradiction, and thus ultimately points beyond itself to a unity without difference or distinction, one that can only be grasped through some kind of emotional experience, intellectual intuition, or form of faith. After considering the various phases of development during this early period, both Düsing and Heidemann carefully examine both how and why Hegel's position evolved.

These essays have a nice complementarity: Düsing focuses on the ontological aspects of this development while Heidemann considers its epistemological features. As Hegel's thought matured, he became increasingly dissatisfied with a conception of the divine as a unity without difference, distinction, or differentiation. He became dissatisfied with the epistemological priority of faith, emotion, or intuition over philosophical cognition. Thus he sought to develop a conception of unity that included difference, a form of cognition that transcended but also essentially relied upon discursivity. Among other things, this required the possibility of thinking contradiction.

Tom Rockmore and Limnatis's essays take a different approach, considering the dialect in terms of the self-reflective and essentially relational structures of subjectivity, particularly as presented in the Phenomenology of Spirit. The self or subject is essentially relational in at least a threefold sense. First, the self is never merely what it is, nor is it simply what it takes itself to be. Instead, it is the relation of what it is in itself to what it is for itself. Second, the self or subject always exists both in relation to and distinction from an objective world. Finally, the self always exists in relation to and distinction from other selves. While Rockmore's essay focuses on the circularity and dialectical progression that derives from the second of these relational features of the self, Limnatis considers the relation between the second and the third features, between the self's relation to an object and to other selves. Such essential relationality suggests at least one possible gloss on Hegel's claim that things (or subjects, in this case) are self-contradictory. If relations constitute a thing, then the essence of the thing also involves what the thing is not -- i.e. the relation that extends beyond the thing.

In yet another approach to this topic, Allen Speight's essay examines the dialectic in terms of the positive or constitutive role that skepticism plays in Hegel's conception of philosophical thought. Specifically, he focuses on the differences between ancient and modern skepticism, and he shows how Hegel's philosophy draws upon the questions, concerns, and techniques of the former variant of skepticism, not upon those of the later.

The contributions from Joseph Margolis, Markus Gabriel, Vittorio Hösle, and Dieter Wandschneider present partial defenses or creative reconstructions of certain features of the dialectic. The most creative or non-standard interpretation comes from Margolis, who employs an admittedly reconstructed Hegel to defend Pierce's pragmatism and Cassirer's open-ended neo-Kantianism against the more contemporary variations of pragmatism presented in the works of Sellars and Brandom. Margolis accuses Sellars and Brandom of retaining vestiges of formalism in their conceptions of thought and logic. By contrast, Margolis's reconstructed Hegel holds that, "logic … emerges out of the contingent practices of cultural life and, reaching for inclusive closure, outstrips its seemingly assured capacity" (204-5). Logic is wholly material and historical, without any purely formal elements. Contradictions inevitably arise from the finitude of human thought, from our failure to grasp totality. Moreover, contradictions play a positive role, since they remind us of our finitude and prevent us from artificially closing off our current, incomplete systems of thought.

Interestingly enough, Gabriel presents a similar account of the dialectic, though he presents it as a faithful interpretation, not as a reconstruction. Gabriel seeks to defend Hegel against the Heideggerian charges of "onto-theology." He insists that Hegel's philosophical project precludes the possibility of finality, since the absolute, the end and ultimate ground of thought, cannot be defined without falsely transforming it into a thing.

Like Margolis, Hösle also engages the works of Sellars, Brandom, and McDowell. In contrast with Margolis and Gabriel, however, he presents a more traditional interpretation of Hegel as a metaphysical thinker who insists upon the ability of thought to grasp the fundamental nature of reality. Hösle argues that Sellars, Brandom, and McDowell ignore the dialectical features of Hegel's thought, thus depriving themselves of possible resources for overcoming the contingency and relativism that threatens their anti-empiricist account of concepts. Systems of concepts, Hösle insists, reflect the structure of reality to varying degrees. Following Kant, Hegel accepts that this reflective relation, which holds between concepts and reality, cannot simply be explained in terms of our passive or empirical receptivity to the very structure of reality itself, as presented in experience. Thought always plays an active and constructive role in the formation of experience and the concepts related to it. Nonetheless, the dialectical and progressive relationship between various systems of concepts allows us to overcome the contingency and relativism that would otherwise seem to be inherent in this anti-empiricist account of concepts.

Wandschneider's essay focuses directly on the nature and role of contradiction within the dialectic. In what he describes as a defensible reconstruction, not as a faithful interpretation, Wandschneider presents contradictions within the dialectic as cases of essential or constitutive semantic relations. Thus, despite their genuine difference, oppositional concepts, such as being and nothing, can only be grasped or conceived in their relational opposition. However, this semantic relation does not imply fundamental ambiguity, for Wandschneider holds that the meanings of being and nothing can still be fully disambiguated or distinguished. "Rightly understood," he insists, "there can be no talk of contradiction" (38).

Klaus Brinkmann's essay delves still further into the perplexing topic of dialectical contradictions. Focusing on the more ontological features of this topic, Brinkmann characterizes Hegel's view in terms of the existence or inclusion of opposites in one another. Brinkmann helpfully points out the asymmetry of this inclusion. Thus, for instance, while identity and difference are contained in one another, Brinkmann nonetheless suggests, albeit in terms that remain troublingly metaphorical, that identity is "stronger" than difference, that identity contains a kind of priority over difference. It is this priority, according to Brinkmann, that allows Hegel to avoid violating the principle of non-contradiction.

Perhaps the most insightful treatment of this problem comes in Düsing's essay, which we have already considered in another respect. Düsing locates the source of contradiction in what he describes as Hegel's "process ontology." If we ontologically prioritize actions or changes over the categories of substance or thing, then traditional approaches for conceiving change, such as the one proposed in Aristotle's Physics, become untenable. In one of the more perspicuous remarks about the source of contradiction within his philosophy, one that clearly supports Düsing's approach, Hegel says: "The ancient dialecticians must be granted the contradictions that they pointed out in motion; but it does not follow that therefore there is no motion, but on the contrary, that motion is existent contradiction itself."[2] If reality is fundamentally dynamic and thus inherently contradictory, then thought, it seems, must somehow come to grasp or think that which is contradictory.

While most of the essays in this volume provide a sympathetic interpretation or defense of Hegel's dialectic, the contributions from Angelica Nuzzo and Elizabeth Millán take a more critical approach. Millán, for instance, favorably contrasts the philosophical open-endedness championed by Friedrich Schlegel and Novalis with what she takes to be the excessive commitment to systematicity inherent in Hegel's dialectical method. In her difficult but suggestive essay, Nuzzo argues that the assumptions and goals of Hegel's Science of Logic should have led him to begin that work with nothingness rather than with being. Moreover, she argues that the initial transition from nothing to being presents the non-dialectical movement whereby thought itself emerges from nothingness.

While admirable and ambitious in its intentions, this volume seems unlikely to elevate the topic of dialectic from its current state of neglect. For one thing, the fundamental disagreements among the volume's authors may serve to increase suspicions about what sometimes seems the hopelessly murky and endlessly ambiguous depths of Hegel's philosophy. Thus, while some authors insist upon the directionality and finality of the dialectic, others characterize the dialectic as essentially open-ended, contingent, and even historically relativistic. Similarly, while some authors construe Hegel as a fundamentally post-Kantian and thus post-metaphysical thinker, others present him as a metaphysician, albeit one who rejects transcendent metaphysics and traditional ontologies of substance.

Additionally, there is a wide range in the quality of the essays. The comprehension of some of the essays demands a high degree of care and attention, a degree of effort that goes unrewarded. Finally, it should be said that many, though not all, of the essays are written in a style and idiom drawn from the continental tradition, not in the more analytic style that continues to dominate much historical scholarship in the Anglophone world. While this more continental approach may be fully justified, given the style, subject matter, and Wirkungsgeschichte of Hegel's philosophy, it will not help to assuage the concerns and suspicions of many Anglophone philosophers, who may otherwise be sympathetic to broadly Hegelian ideas, nor, for that matter, is it likely to convince more analytically-oriented Hegel scholars to delve into this central but often ignored topic.

[1] Hegel, G.W.F. Science of Logic. Trans. A.V. Miller. Humanity Books, Amherst. p. 412.

[2] Ibid., p. 440.