The Disappearance of Moral Knowledge

Placeholder book cover

Dallas Willard, The Disappearance of Moral Knowledge, Steven L. Porter, Aaron Preston, and Gregg A. Ten Elshof (eds.), Routledge, 2018, 387pp., $160.00 (hbk), ISBN 9781138589254.

Reviewed by Adam Pelser, United States Air Force Academy


To many twenty-first-century ears the phrase "moral knowledge" sounds like an oxymoron. Knowledge is understood to belong in the realm of objective facts and empirical science, while morality is understood to belong in the realm of subjective opinions, values, and feelings -- and never the twain shall meet. The distinction between these two realms has become such an established tenet of cultural orthodoxy that it is widely assumed to be obvious without question and without argument. But this has not always been so. As the editors of Dallas Willard's book explain in their Introduction,

Until the early twentieth century, the prevailing view in Western culture, including its leading intellectuals and ethical theorists, had been that a systematic body of moral knowledge (and in that sense a 'science' of ethics) was possible, and necessary for managing human life successfully. (xviii)

Throughout this book, which Scott Soames in his Foreword deems Willard's "most important philosophical work" (viii), Willard undertakes to explain how and why this radical shift in cultural attitudes toward moral knowledge arose. He argues that although many individuals still possess moral knowledge today in the sense that they are "able to represent [morality] as it is on an adequate basis of thought or experience" (19), moral knowledge "does not . . . present itself as a publically accessible resource for living and living together" (xxx). He elaborates,

it is now true that knowledge of moral distinctions and phenomena is not made available as a public resource; and most of those who supervise the course of events in our institutions of knowledge -- principally those of 'higher education' -- think that such knowledge should not, morally ought not, be made available through them. (xxxi)

It is this loss of moral knowledge as a publically accessible resource that Willard terms "The Disappearance of Moral Knowledge."

Willard's rich and poignant treatment of this topic is a mix of intellectual history, philosophical analysis of ethical theory, and a sketch of his own positive moral epistemology. He begins by surveying what he takes to be the main cultural causes of the disappearance of moral knowledge (ch. 1) and concludes the book (ch. 8) by offering a sketch of his own positive epistemology of moral knowledge, certain features of which he takes to be both necessary and helpful for the recovery of moral knowledge within our society today. There is much of value in these two chapters alone, especially for those readers primarily interested in Willard's diagnosis of the disappearance of moral knowledge and his prescription for our cultural recovery from this condition.

In the middle six chapters, Willard offers a deeply insightful exploration of the key developments in late nineteenth- and twentieth-century ethical theory that coincided with and in some ways facilitated the disappearance of moral knowledge. Whereas the first and final chapters provide the reader with a bird's-eye view of the deforestation of the forest of moral knowledge, along with Willard's proposal for its reforestation, the intervening chapters provide the reader with a close, ground-level view of the part he thinks certain philosophers played -- in some cases unwittingly -- in uprooting the trees of moral knowledge. Ethical theorists whose works Willard explores include Herbert Spencer, T.H. Green, and Franz Brentano (ch. 2), G.E. Moore (ch. 3), A.J. Ayer, C.L. Stevenson, and Hans Reichenbach (ch. 4), Stephen Toulmin and Richard Hare (ch. 5), John Rawls (ch. 6), and Alasdair MacIntyre (ch.7). These chapters would be excellent reading for advanced undergraduate and graduate seminars in the history of twentieth-century ethics. Even apart from Willard's assessment of the cultural disappearance of moral knowledge, students and scholars of twentieth-century ethics will find much of interest in his fresh and penetrating analysis of these philosophers' ethical theories.

Although Willard's treatment of the aforementioned ethical theorists is impressively thorough in many ways -- e.g., tracing Rawls' and MacIntyre's views on moral knowledge from Rawls' dissertation and MacIntyre's master's thesis all the way through their latest works -- his aim is not to provide a comprehensive history of twentieth-century ethics. Rather, he focuses on those developments in ethical theory that he takes to be most closely related to -- and perhaps indirectly responsible for (more on this below) -- the disappearance of moral knowledge. He argues that a careful investigation into this history, together with an appreciation of the broader cultural causes of the shift in attitudes toward moral knowledge, will reveal that "the disappearance of moral knowledge, in the manner reviewed, is not an expression of truth rationally secured, but is the outcome of an historical drift, with no rational justification at all or only the thinnest show of one" (44). In their very helpful Introduction to the book, the editors identify this claim as the book's main thesis (xix).

While I find Willard's argument for his main thesis largely compelling and I am sympathetic with his desire for the recovery of moral knowledge as a publically accessible resource, throughout the remainder of this review I will offer a friendly critique of some elements of his explanation of the disappearance of moral knowledge and of his proposal for its recovery.

Before proceeding, however, it is worth pausing to note that Willard did not complete this book before his death in 2013. After his death, the final three chapters were completed by three of his former graduate students, Steven L. Porter, Aaron Preston, and Gregg A. Ten Elshof. They are to be commended for their painstaking efforts to represent Willard's critiques of Rawls and MacIntyre as accurately as possible, based on Willard's unfinished drafts and miscellaneous notes. The editors completed the final chapter (on which I will focus part of my critique below) by combining material from two distinct unfinished drafts together with some of Willard's previously published works. I will proceed under the assumption that the views presented in the final chapters are Willard's own, though of course he might well have addressed some of the concerns I raise here had he been able to complete and revise the manuscript himself.

Even if we limit our focus to the chapters Willard completed, one perplexing feature of the book is that it is marked by a conspicuous ambivalence regarding the role and importance of professional moral philosophy in the disappearance of moral knowledge. On the one hand, Willard explicitly downplays the importance of philosophers in the shaping of common attitudes toward moral knowledge. He explains,

what we are talking about here as 'the disappearance of moral knowledge' is not a philosophical position but a public fact . . . in which certain philosophers may have played some role -- quite indirect and indecisive for the most part -- through influence they have had on some social institutions. (7-8)

Likewise, in reference to the rise of ethical Noncognitivism, Existentialism, and Deconstruction, Willard explains,

Moral knowledge, as such, was long gone from educational and social institutions before those philosophical movements arrived. The underlying dynamics of the shift were much deeper and broader than a few lines of arcane philosophical reasoning which, indeed, only a handful of people (if that) ever thoroughly understood. (29-30)

Yet, on the other hand, Willard devotes almost three-hundred pages to close, careful evaluations of the primary developments in ethical theory that contributed to the disappearance of moral knowledge, frequently emphasizing their significance for the broader cultural shift. Regarding Moore's attempt to develop a "science" of ethics, for example, Willard writes,

Now it is clear, I think, that his work played a very significant, if unintended, role in 'the disappearance of moral knowledge' . . . The outcome of his efforts to secure moral knowledge, by developing it in the form of a science as he understood that, was to leave moral knowledge in an extremely precarious position in its institutional setting, to say the very least. (156)

Similarly, in evaluation of the impact of Logical Positivism and its Verificationist theory of meaning, Willard explains,

given the triumph of Verificationism -- however fleeting -- the problem of how to locate ethics, the study of the moral life, in the new order of intellectual respectability established by the mid-twentieth century became pressing . . . [Verificationism] and its Emotivist spin-off in ethics had hollowed out an enduring space in the dominant thought world that leaves Verification's shadowy presence still a highly potent force. (173)

Further underscoring the significance of philosophy for the disappearance of moral knowledge, Willard traces the disappearance through four main "stages," three of which are developments in twentieth-century ethical theory (344-348).

While Willard's competing claims about the role of philosophy in the disappearance of moral knowledge are not strictly contradictory, they are at least in strong tension with one another. The editors acknowledge this tension in their Introduction, noting that "Philosophy's relation to the disappearance is complicated" (xix). They explain that although the influence of philosophers on cultural attitudes toward moral knowledge is "limited," philosophers are those whose job it is "to develop and assess moral epistemologies." Thus, if there are good reasons for or against the possibility of moral knowledge, "philosophy should have been the discipline to point that out" (xix-xx).

This explanation notwithstanding, Willard's comments throughout -- and, indeed, the very scope of the book -- leave one wondering whether he thinks that the role of philosophical ethical theories in giving rise to, or at least facilitating, the disappearance of moral knowledge from our culture was "indirect and indecisive" or "very significant" and "highly potent." Given the amount of time and energy he spends tracing developments in ethical theory and moral epistemology through the twentieth century, it seems that he leans toward the latter view, despite some of his comments that might suggest otherwise.

Willard's ambivalence regarding the role of philosophy in contributing to the disappearance of moral knowledge is not solely a matter of historical interpretation. For, whether and to what degree philosophy contributed to the disappearance is relevant to the prospective role of philosophy in helping our society to recover moral knowledge as a publically accessible resource today. Here, too, Willard's view is marked by some ambivalence.

On the one hand, he argues that "it is the responsibility of our 'institutions of knowledge' to make moral knowledge available in the extent to which that is possible" (380). Remarking on this theme, Soames writes in his Foreword that "Reading The Disappearance of Moral Knowledge . . . one can hear Dallas quietly telling us that the time has come for philosophy to take up its obligation" to shoulder "a greater share of the contemporary burden of articulating a compelling moral vision" (x). It may well be that Willard offers such a quiet admonition to philosophers in this book, but at the same time he not so quietly expresses serious doubts about the ability of philosophers to effect a recovery of moral knowledge from within the context of our current institutions of higher education: "I cannot imagine any circumstances in which institutions of higher education as we now know them could teach moral knowledge" (377).

So, if Willard is calling on philosophers to help revive moral knowledge in our society, he is either calling on us to do so independently of our official professional roles -- leaving mysterious what the institutional "home" of recovered moral knowledge might be -- or he is calling on us to work toward the radical transformation of our institutions of higher education. Either way, though, he makes it clear that he thinks the role of ethical theorists is crucial to the recovery of moral knowledge:

Moral inquiry and theory development is an absolute necessity for there to be moral knowledge adequate to life, though of course it is not necessary for every individual to engage in theory development in order for him or her to be a morally good person. But someone had better do it. (376)

In his final chapter Willard attempts to aid future work in this area by offering a sketch of his own moral epistemology and ethical theory, features of which he thinks are necessary for the recovery of moral knowledge. I turn now to a brief consideration of his theory.

Willard begins his sketch by arguing that any adequate moral epistemology must start with the realization that "The appropriate 'shape' of moral understanding and knowledge is more like that of Medicine or Geography, for example, than like that of Geometry or Physics" (357). This insight is supposed to help us avoid the trap, stepped into by twentieth-century ethical theorists, of trying to make morality out to be a "science" in the narrow sense of the natural sciences, or a set of propositions all logically entailed by first principles -- a project which, as he argues throughout the book, is bound to fail.

With our expectations for moral knowledge properly circumscribed, Willard argues that moral knowledge must begin with knowledge of good persons, such as saints or heroes, whom we identify through admiration (359). Here, his proposal bears a striking similarity to Linda Zabzebski's "Exemplarist Moral Theory."[1] Like Zagzebski, Willard argues that the concept of the good person will clarify all other moral concepts and distinctions, thereby serving as the foundation of a comprehensive and systematic (though not logically deductive) "science" or theory of ethics (360).

Despite their close similarities, one conspicuous dissimilarity with Zagzebski's moral epistemology is that Willard attempts to connect his exemplarist moral theory with the phenomenological ethical particularism of Knud Løgstrup and Emmanuel Levinas. While I think ethical theorists who wish to take up Willard's call to revive moral knowledge might have something to learn from the phenomenological tradition on which he draws, his attempt to connect this tradition to a Zagzebski-style exemplarist moral theory seems a bit forced. For, Løgstrup and Levinas argue that moral epistemology consists in direct awareness of one's obligations toward "the other," rather than in one's direct moral awareness of the goodness of moral exemplars.

Another dissimilarity between Willard's and Zagzebski's moral epistemologies can be seen in Willard's apparent uneasiness about emotions. Whereas Zagzebski has argued that it is appropriate in many cases to trust our emotions, such as admiration, as the basis of our knowledge of the good person, Willard appeals to moral emotions but balks at calling them "emotions," preferring instead to call them "attitudes."

This uneasiness about emotions unfortunately hampers Willard's moral epistemology. For, although he is wary of the term "intuition" on account of the standard criticism of the Intuitionists that they appeal to a mysterious faculty as the basis of their moral epistemology, he reluctantly employs this term in his attempt to describe the faculty through which we can come to know the goodness or badness of persons:

there is moral knowledge accessible to any thoughtful person, even though there is now no generally acknowledged body of moral knowledge. This accessible moral knowledge is rooted in our non-empirical awareness of the will and its properties -- we have no better term for this than the unfortunate word 'intuition'. (367)

But we do have a better word -- namely, "emotion." In fact, just a few pages prior (359) Willard explains that it is the emotion (he calls it an "attitude") of admiration through which we identify the good person (or, will), and in just two more pages he will explain that "The appropriate response to actions in extreme situations may not be a moral judgment at all, but one of pity or admiration, one of the tragic sense of life or amazement at what humans are capable of, etc." (369). In light of these observations, it is somewhat surprising that Willard does not explicitly appeal to a positive epistemological role for emotions (rather than "intuition") as a kind of direct perceptual awareness of the moral goodness or badness of persons.

Although emotion is often misunderstood, at least it is not a mysterious faculty like "intuition." Perhaps Willard is wary of identifying emotion by name as an important part of his moral epistemology because of the way its name has been tarnished by the Emotivists and other Noncognitivists. Yet, I submit that we will not be able to make the kind of progress Willard desires toward developing an adequate account of moral knowledge and articulating a compelling vision of the moral life unless we engage in the difficult moral-psychological project of understanding emotion and restoring emotion's good name. A robust epistemology of emotion thus would go a long way toward strengthening and filling out Willard's account of moral knowledge.

These worries aside, Willard's book is a profound and timely contribution to the history of ethical theory and to the future of moral epistemology. It is essential reading for all who wish to understand the broad cultural drift away from moral knowledge in the twentieth century and for all who wish to contribute to the recovery of moral knowledge in the twenty-first century.[2]

[1] Linda Zagzebski, Exemplarist Moral Theory (Oxford: Oxford UP, 2017). The editors of Willard's book briefly note the similarity between his view and Zagzebski's in an endnote, but there is no discussion of her work in the main text of the chapter since her work on this theme was published after Willard's death.

[2] DISCLAIMER: The views expressed here are the author's own and do not necessarily reflect the policy or position of the US Air Force, the Department of Defense, or the US government.