The Disordered Mind: An Introduction to Philosophy of Mind and Mental Illness

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George Graham, The Disordered Mind: An Introduction to Philosophy of Mind and Mental Illness, Routledge, 2009, 288 pp., $37.95 (pbk), ISBN 9780415774727.

Reviewed by Dominic Murphy, University of Sydney, and Gemma Smart, University of Sydney



George Graham has a longstanding reputation as a distinguished philosopher of psychiatry, and The Disordered Mind shows why. Its scope is broad and its presentation is clear and precise. It is a very impressive statement of a widespread and important philosophical perspective on mental illness, which everyone studying the philosophy of psychiatry will want to read. However, we are unsympathetic to that perspective. Despite the many merits of Graham’s book, we doubt that his approach, however well articulated, will prove fruitful in the end if we seek a deeper understanding and explanation of psychopathology. However, it is certainly valuable to have this perspective presented with the flair and clarity shown here. The book successfully shows how topics in the philosophy of mind can illuminate discussions of mental disorder. It is clear enough, and vividly enough written, to be assigned fruitfully to undergraduates, but it also makes enough contributions to the central debates in the field to be important for specialists.

We will mostly discuss Graham’s presentation of the big picture. This takes up the first two-thirds of the book. There are discussions of several diagnoses along the way, but most of the psychiatric details come in the last three chapters. These apply the overall framework to addiction, psychotic phenomena like delusion and thought insertion, and some other topics including dissociation, which all lead into a final discussion of whether psychopathology makes a difference to the metaphysics of the self.

One way to think about philosophy of psychiatry is as a branch of the philosophy of science, looking at the conceptual basis, theory building, and explanatory models of psychiatry and the allied sciences of the unsound mind. That is not Graham’s approach. He is advocating a specifically philosophical take on psychopathology, in which philosophical accounts of how the mind works are central. An account of mental illness that treats it as a neurological problem, Graham thinks, is anti-realist (p.10). A realist about mental illness sees it as a problem with minds, rather than brains or biology, and our best accounts of how the mind works are philosophical rather than scientific.

Graham’s basic idea is that mental illnesses are “capacity-tethered rationality impairments” (p.137). This means that in mental disorder fundamental human mental faculties are, as he says, “gummed-up” through a mixture of intentional causes and brute ones; conspiracies of mental and non-mental states interfere with the normal operation of our basic human psychology. How do we know what that psychology is? Not through scientific inquiry, but by reflecting on the ends or purposes that all human beings share — it is the psychology that you need to live a decent life (p. 139). Graham puts philosophical psychopathology squarely in the philosophy of mind, and embeds philosophy of mind within a broader moral psychology. The aspects of the mind we care about are the ones that help us flourish. It is deliberation on the ends of life, not the science of the mind, which tells us what is psychologically important. So Graham’s list of basic psychological faculties does not include working memory or perception or language comprehension, but things like (pp. 147-150) emotional commitment, the ability to act in the world, to form goals and shape our behaviour to fit them, make choices, and so on.

What makes these capacities mental (and therefore distinguishes them from the wider set of human capacities necessary for wellbeing) is that their exercise involves states that are conscious or that possess intentionality (ch. 2). Mental disorders come about when these capacities get “gummed up” in such a way that one is harmed — because one lacks a capacity necessary for flourishing — against one’s will, and in a way that usually requires treatment by others (ch. 3). We think this is too vague, however. Lots of things inhibit our ability to flourish and are beyond our unaided powers to mitigate, but are not diseases — physical ugliness and illiteracy are examples. We need to know about the specific forms of being worse off that illnesses involve. Suppose I am very inattentive, and I often forget things or miss deadlines, and my life goes worse than it might as a result. Am I mentally disordered with a gummed up mind, or just absentminded?

The overall framework is defended in chapter four against various sorts of scepticism. Metaphysical sceptics think that a distinctively mental account of mental illness, as opposed to a reductive, physical account, is untenably dualistic. Moral sceptics are Szaszians, who think that diagnosing someone with a mental illness is just the imposition of an arbitrary value judgement. Graham defends a nonreductive physicalism against the metaphysical sceptic. Against the moral sceptic, he argues that mental illness and somatic illness are on a par. It is not that medicine is value-neutral while psychiatry is normative, but that both are normative. Since medicine in general is “evaluative or normative through and through” (p. 93) it is not distinguishable from psychiatry, as Thomas Szasz argued, on the grounds that proper science is not normative.

The presence of evaluative assumptions in medicine is clear enough. However, many theorists have argued that to call something a disease involves both a judgment that some organ system is dysfunctional and a judgment that the consequences are bad for the sufferer, and that judgments of the first kind are not normative — or at least, that norms governing natural function of physical systems are of a different kind than the moral or political norms involved in judgments that a dysfunction is harmful for its owner. This might not be correct, but Graham doesn’t really talk about it. If the outcome of a physical process is bad for you in distinctive ways, then it is a disease, he thinks, regardless of the status of the system. Furthermore, as we have seen, Graham goes on to argue that the picture of human nature relevant to psychiatry is an explicitly philosophical one, based on a conception of human flourishing. The moral skeptic can argue in return that there is still a big difference in this picture between psychiatry and somatic medicine. The latter rests on well-established scientific findings whereas psychiatry is based on a philosophical account of the capacities needed for human flourishing. Graham’s view is that the human capacities he picks out are those that we would choose behind a veil of ignorance. They are the ones that we are bound to need no matter what life we decide to pursue.

But this is contestable. Suppose I decide that a human life would go a lot more smoothly, with much less suffering, if I just did not care for others at all, or that on balance I might be much more successful if I had the kind of psychology that subordinated everything to work. Certainly, if you have decided that caring for others is a component of the good life — or if you are just stuck with caring for others, because that’s how human beings are – then interference with the capacity for care will be harmful and stressing. But there are lots of respectable philosophical antecedents for the idea that the less engaged you are with the world, the better. Graham assumes that nobody would choose to be a successful, prudent sociopath, but if material gain and worldly power are at the centre of your ambitions, then why not? At the heart of the book is a moral vision of the best life for a human being — an objective theory of well-being. Mental disorders are the psychological impairments to attaining that good life.

The last component of Graham’s big picture is a theory of the connection between rationality and intentionality. The thesis of rationality in intentionality (p. 120), which Graham finds in Daniel Dennett, Donald Davidson and John Searle, holds that intentional states are by nature rational — that is, they are interpretable and interrelated according to rational constraints. For something to count as an intentional state it needs to be related to other intentional states in the right way. (However, we think that to do some of the philosophical work he expects from his theory of how the mind works Graham also needs a theory of rational warrant that evaluates how contents get in to the mind, and not just an account of transitions among states of mind.)

In mental disorders, Graham thinks, the rational relationships between contents are disrupted by mechanical processes. The rational works are gummed up by mechanical processes. But the details of this story are hard to see. At times Graham talks as though rational and mechanical processes are both causes of mental illnesses, and at other times he talks as though the abnormal rational processes constitute the symptoms of mental illness. These let us comprehend the experience of the disorder, but their upstream causes are mechanical. We take it that Graham thinks the former — that it is a necessary condition of mental disorders that they have a brute cause. For example, he says that wishful thinking doesn’t count, even though it is irrational, because the causes of wishful thinking are intentional states like desires, and not mechanical processes (p. 131). On the other hand, we are less clear whether he thinks that intentional causes are necessarily in the mix too. He does say (p. 127) that in mental disorder the proximate causes cannot be fully comprehended in mechanical terms. But if mental illness has to have a mix of mechanical and intentional causes then some paradigmatic conditions look as though they might be left out of the picture. It is unclear, for example, whether mood disorders always have intentional causes. They may always involve disturbances of thought among their symptoms, but it is unclear that mood disorders are always conditions one thinks one’s way into, as opposed to being pushed into by brute chemical causes.

The same seems true of many psychotic states — they may preserve some rational capacities but often seem to have mechanical causes. Graham deals with worries like this in the case of delusion by arguing (pp. 202-3, 211) that what matters is the role that the delusion plays in the mental life of the subject. The explanation of why the delusion gets into the mind in the first place is beside the point. But if we want a full theory of delusion, why should it be beside the point? Graham argues that deluded individuals are rationally gummed up because of the role that the delusion plays in their subsequent mental life, and these consequences are the key to understanding the delusional experience. This is true, but there might be more to a theory of delusion than understanding the delusional experience, despite the theoretical and human importance of the latter. It may be that our confusion here stems from a distinction between causes and symptoms that Graham may not recognize, so that symptoms count as sustaining causes of the disorder. We think he could be clearer about this, but even so it seems that a full account of states like delusion would pay attention to mechanical processes that Graham’s account omits.

This brings up an important perplexity that we have about the aim of the overall project. The Disordered Mind offers you a philosophical package deal, put together with impressive thoroughness and consistency. The overall impression is of an ambitious, cohesive theory. But although the book often talks of the sources or causes of mental illness, it seems to us that its real value lies in using philosophical tools to illuminate the world of the mentally disordered and the experience and significance of their various fates. This is an important task and Graham does it very well, but it makes a difference to the book’s place in the overall context of philosophy of psychiatry.

Our main reservation, as may be already evident, has to do with the appeal and prospects of the overall package deal that Graham offers, and its relationship to more reductive or scientistic pictures of psychiatry. There is a tendency to oppose the realism about the mental here to a more brain-based approach without ever really spelling out what a brain-based approach looks like. As things stand the conception of brain-based psychopathology that is argued against is too reductive, especially since Nancy Andreasen features as a foil (pp. 28-9), and she thinks psychiatry is a form of cognitive neuroscience. In particular, we would like to know why one does not get realism about the mental as part of a brain-based approach if you take the mental as a matter of information processing systems, as in the standard pictures of cognitive neuroscience that are making increasing inroads in psychiatry. The medical model stipulates that mental disorder depends on malfunctions in physical systems. There is nothing in it to make us conclude that those systems cannot be information-processing ones and hence both causal-mechanical and intentional. Hence, it is entirely within the logic of the medical model that one could have a subpersonal dysfunction in the absence of anatomical or physiological deficits. The cognitive picture retains a role for psychology (though not folk psychology) but one that is integrated with science much more fully than Graham’s picture. Graham seems to think, on the other hand, that there is a sharp distinction between intentional states and mechanical ones. We worry that this leads to a narrowly philosophical agenda that robs his approach of explanatory power.

We can see this in Graham’s discussion of addiction, which sidesteps debates on mental versus neurological explanation to understand addiction as a pattern of behaviour that contravenes attempts to take responsibility for the self (p. 172-3). Graham singles out two ‘constituents or elements’ as instrumental in one’s responsibility for self: evaluative self-reflection and behavioural self-control (p. 163). In this picture, addicts may have some breakdown in behavioural self-control (or impulse control). Graham examines the similarities between compulsion and addiction but doubts the explanatory status that other writers have given to craving. “Attribution of insatiability is not in general a veridical way in which to picture the impulse or motivation behind either a general addictive pattern or the particular stage of relapse, although it does depict certain individual cases” (p. 166). Rather, Graham focuses on the relapsing stage of the typical “clinical coalface case of addiction” (p. 160). Relapse is important to him because it highlights the addict’s lack of self responsibility, “It is difficult to explain how something that is negatively evaluated or believed by the agent to be harmful retains a grip on behaviour” (p. 164). Relapse is an instance of being in some important way unable to take responsibility for self.

Graham describes self-responsible persons as historical beings, operating within a framework of past and future “projects, aspirations and goals” (p. 170), and it is from this definition that he forms his idea of selfhood. Significantly he asserts that, “Self-responsible people care about the future” (p. 170). Addicts are neither completely rational nor entirely irrational, but they may have some breakdown in their ability to self-reflect, to see themselves as a historically continuous being. The impulse to consume may be “life-defining for an addict” (p. 171). Like Ross et al. (2008), Graham argues that neurological models, specifically non-human models, cannot adequately explain this particular form of break-down. Addicts ought to know the risks of using, so why do they relapse? But whereas Ross et al. try to integrate brain science and behavioural economics to explain this, Graham looks to metaphysics: “It requires also a metaphysical assumption about persons” (p. 184). The idea of persons as bearers of histories and biographies is widespread in the literature on narrative selfhood but we do not find it particularly illuminating. And it raises normative questions which Graham does not specifically address: How engaged in our history and future should persons be? Is it enough to care about the medium term or must I have clear projects for every stage of my future life? and what if addicts do care about the future but find themselves unable to prevent a relapse? Graham does say that addicts suffer from a “deficit of rational resolve” (p. 184). This is uncomfortably close to just saying that it’s all their fault for being so weak-willed, but in any case it doesn’t explain anything, even though it might characterise aspects of the addictive experience helpfully. Furthermore, it just isn’t clear that there are any explanatory resources here within folk psychological categories, even ones articulated with great philosophical ingenuity.

From our philosophical perspective, this points to the biggest failing of the package deal that Graham offers. Its explanatory powers are only as great as those of philosophy of mind, understood in a traditional sense as the philosophical elaboration of our understanding of our mental life. Philosophers of a less naturalistic bent will doubtless disagree, and prefer the agenda that Graham sets. We think this is unlikely to do much to tell us about the causes of mental disorder or provide a way to integrate psychiatry and the other sciences of the mind. We think of the book not as offering a causal-explanatory account of mental disorder, but as a philosophical contribution to descriptive psychopathology. Even for philosophers of our persuasion the book can be read as an important contribution to philosophical understanding of the human experience of mental illness.


Ross D., Sharp C., Vuchinich, R.E, and Spurrett, D., Midbrain Mutiny: The Picoeconomics and Neuroeconomics of Disordered Gambling: Economic Theory and Cognitive Science, MIT Press, 2008.