The Divine Order, the Human Order, and the Order of Nature: Historical Perspectives

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Eric Watkins (ed.), The Divine Order, the Human Order, and the Order of Nature: Historical Perspectives, Oxford University Press, 2013, 240pp., $74.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780199934409.

Reviewed by John Whipple, University of Illinois at Chicago


In this collection of specially commissioned essays, Eric Watkins brings together an all-star cast of historians of philosophy, and the results do not disappoint. It is a very fine collection, indeed. The essays are strong considered individually, and they also contribute to a compelling general theme. The theme revolves around the notion of order in its various manifestations -- natural, moral, human, and divine. Watkins suggests -- and the papers in the volume amply demonstrate -- that by focusing on the different forms of order and their relations, a promising narrative can be constructed for understanding the developments in Western philosophy during the modern period.

In recent years a number of historians have challenged the traditional empiricist-rationalist-Kant narrative, suggesting alternative narratives that focus on the threat of skepticism, or the attempt to provide an appropriate epistemology and metaphysics for the new sciences, or that emphasize the implications of metaphysics and epistemology for the problem of evil or for the moral and sociopolitical ideal of freedom. Watkins thinks these alternative narratives all speak to important philosophical interests in the modern period, but considered individually they tell only a partial story. The notion of order, he claims, can provide a broader narrative capable of incorporating many of the insights of the other narratives. The volume as a whole provides strong support for this general thesis; it shows that a narrative focused on the notion of order is promising and worth filling out in greater detail in future research.

The book is divided into three parts, one on the medieval period (two essays), one on the early modern period (six essays), and one on Kant (two essays). As befits the theme of the book, some of the essays provide comparative treatments while others explore the views of a single philosopher in great detail. Tad Schmaltz, for example, provides an account of the role of laws and order in the philosophical systems of Malebranche, Berkeley, and Hume, while Andrew Chignell provides an account of the role that hope plays at the intersection of Kant's treatment of the moral and divine orders. The first part, which provides a great deal of important background information for the second and third parts, discusses the views of Aquinas, Scotus, Ockham, and Maimonides. The second part includes discussions of all of the major early modern philosophers, with the exception of Locke. I will now provide some more detailed comments on several of the essays included in this book.

The first essay is Marilyn McCord Adams' "Powers versus Laws: God and the Order of the World According to Some Late Medieval Aristotelians." Adams covers a great deal of ground in this condensed and informative essay, which focuses on the views of Aquinas, Scotus, and Ockham, while also providing helpful contrasts with other medieval philosophers such as Avicenna and ‪Averroës.  She shows how each of the three central figures sought to explain the non-trivial regularities observed in nature not by laws of nature, but by appealing to formal functional principles that are internal to substances. The formal principles, which constitute the natures of substances, are either powers or emanate from powers. It is thus powers, not laws, which (in part) determine the order of nature. Strictly speaking, the category of law applies only to free rational agents who are capable of understanding and obeying or disobeying moral laws that are promulgated by God. The natural order also depends on the divine order insofar as God creates finite substances along with their causal powers, conserves them in their existence, and concurs with them to produce effects within the ordinary course of nature (no finite substance is capable of acting on its own). God freely chooses to create certain substances rather than others and adopts various concurrence policies so as to providentially order the world to an end. The differences and nuances of Aquinas', Scotus', and Ockham's views on these matters are interesting, and Adams does an impressive job of bringing so many of them to light in a single paper.

Steven Nadler provides an interpretation of Maimonides' theodicy. He skillfully explains the different general strategies that Maimonides employs in engaging the central questions of theodicy, and effectively isolates key points of disagreement among scholars of Maimonides' thought, but his positive interpretation might have been more fully developed. In broad strokes, Maimonides' aim is to provide a rational explanation for the existence of evil without resorting to an anthropomorphic conception of God. His taxonomy of evils is three-fold. First, there are evils such as bodily injuries and infirmities. Second, there are evils such as deceit, tyrannical domination, and physical harm that human beings inflict on one another. Third, there are evils such as intemperate eating and drinking that an individual brings upon himself. Maimonides uses some (now) historically familiar lines of defense including the idea that "all evils are privations" and several versions of the "greater good" or "consider the whole" strategy. While some of these strategies are useful, Nadler does not think that they fully engage the central question of the problem of evil: why do innocent people sometimes suffer while the wicked prosper?

Maimonides provides an answer to this question in his fascinating treatment of divine providence. He distinguishes between general and individual providence. The former, which is (typically) equally provided to all members of the species, consists in endowing creatures with characteristics that are oriented to their preservation. Individual providence, in contrast, consists in the "emanation" or "overflow" of knowledge from God through the separate intellects to the human intellect. To the extent that a person is virtuous that person receives the divine overflow and is thus under the protection of providence. Maimonides makes some remarkable claims about the providential protection that the virtuous person is afforded, including the following in Guide Part III, chapter 51: "no evil at all will befall him [the virtuous person] . . . If you should happen to pass on your way a widely extended field of battle and even if one thousand were killed to your left and ten thousand to your right, no evil at all would befall you."

This passage has long been puzzling to Maimonides' readers. One might think that such protection from the evils of the world could only be obtained through miraculous intervention. But that approach would run afoul of the naturalistic tenor of Maimonides approach to providence. Some commentators have suggested that it is more plausible not to take Maimonides' claim literally here: what he really means is that if a person's mind is fixed on God as the true and lasting good, she will attained a state of spiritual well-being, and will not be troubled by the vagaries of chance that might harm her body. Nadler, on the other hand, suggests that we can take Maimonides at his word in III 51 -- without having to resort to miraculous intervention. He suggests that the knowledge that emanates to the virtuous person from God involves both "divine science" and "natural science." The virtuous person will thus have extraordinarily accurate predictive power given her deep knowledge of nature. Moral luck, for such a person, "will be reduced to an absolute minimum" (38). Maimonides' answer, then, to the question of why innocent people suffer is simply that they do not: if someone suffers it is because he has done something to break the bond to God and the overflow, thus removing himself from the protection of providence.

Several things are puzzling about this account. First, it is difficult not to question how a thinker of Maimonides' caliber could have been committed to it. Could he really have thought that the virtuous person would be able to use her extensive knowledge of nature to avoid volcanic eruptions, earthquakes, lightning strikes, and thousands of arrows falling from the sky on the battlefield? Second, even if this were plausible, it is not obvious that the virtuous person would be able to avoid the second type of evils mentioned earlier, namely those that are inflicted by other humans. If Maimonides has a libertarian account of free will, as some commentators have argued, then the natural knowledge emanating from the divine overflow would be insufficient to insulate the virtuous person from malevolent free human actions. Some account of the relation between Maimonides' theodicy and his account of human freedom needs to be provided. Third, the account does not address the many evils that are inflicted upon infants and young children. It would not seem very satisfactory to say that some infants deserve to die from starvation because they have not sufficiently attended to the divine overflow. Does this large class of evils simply fall outside the scope of divine providence? Does Maimonides have a different strategy for addressing these evils, or is this something that he fails to consider? The reader is left to wonder.

In "God, Laws, and the Order of Nature: Descartes and Leibniz, Hobbes and Spinoza," Daniel Garber explores the question of what happens to the order of nature when the idea of a transcendent God is rejected. For Descartes the laws of nature are grounded in divine immutability and the nature of God's conservation of the universe. For Leibniz the laws of nature are grounded in divine wisdom and God's choice of the best. Hobbes and Spinoza, on the other hand, do not appeal to God to ground the laws of nature. For these two thinkers -- though the details of their views differ in important ways -- nature is ordered by general principles that are on par with the truths of geometry.

Robert Adams' contribution is "Malebranche's Causal Concepts." A significant amount of scholarly work has been done on Malebranche's view on causation in recent years, but I believe that this essay will come to be regarded as the landmark treatment of the topic. One of the most impressive things about the essay is the way that Adams deploys systematic considerations to elucidate Malebranche's views and to resolve interpretive controversies. For example, in seeking to adjudicate a disagreement about how to understand Malebranche's model of occasional causation, he appeals to Malebranche's little discussed account of how God only permits the bad effects that occur in the world. This account turns on a subtle distinction between vouloir simplement and vouloir faire, which Adams thinks should be understood against the backdrop of a medieval distinction between God's antecedent and consequent will. He argues that this account of divine permission, in conjunction with other systematic considerations, shows that God's general volitions by themselves are sufficient to necessitate the occurrence of events within the ordinary course of nature when the relevant occasional causes occur. One of Malebranche's most famous claims is that genuine causation requires a necessary connection between the cause and the effect. In his analysis of genuine causation Adams argues that necessary connection is a necessary but not sufficient condition for being a genuine cause. A genuine cause, for Malebranche, must also act by its own efficacy -- a position that allows him to uphold an important asymmetry between causes and effects.

Adams' essay includes an illuminating discussion of Malebranche's claims about the perception of necessary connection in his account of genuine causation. The discussion is framed within the context of Malebranche's epistemological theory of vision in God. Adams argues, among other things, that the "no necessary connection" argument for occasionalism becomes less important in Malebranche's later writings but that he does not abandon it. Malebranche's central argument for occasionalism in his later writings is based on the thesis that God conserves the world by continuously creating it. While this argument can seem powerful, it is difficult to see how his commitment to continuous creation and occasionalism can leave any room for human freedom. This apparent tension is easy to see and difficult, if not impossible, to resolve. Adams argues that Malebranche's theory of free will introduces two concepts that are different from his concepts of genuine and occasional causes, namely the concept of a power of freely self-determining action and the concept of inclinations. Sufficiently elaborated, these additional concepts show that Malebranche's commitment to the thesis that God is the only genuine cause is consistent with his theory of free will, for while a genuine cause must necessitate its effect, a free act cannot be necessitated at all. His theory of free will is also "at least formally consistent" with the doctrine of continuous creation because a created mind's free consent is "nothing real or positive" and only things that are "real or positive" can be continuously created. While Adams makes a strong case for this being Malebranche's view, I find it difficult to regard this aspect of the reconciliation to be particularly satisfying insofar as it seems to reduce free acts of consent and non-consent to nothingness.

No one has done more to explain the importance of the notion of order in Leibniz's philosophy than Donald Rutherford, whose Leibniz and the Rational Order of Nature is one of the most important books about Leibniz. Here Rutherford builds on some of the insights of his seminal book in "Laws and Powers in Leibniz." It is well known that both laws and powers play important roles in Leibniz's understanding of the order of nature, but spelling out the all-important details of his view is no easy matter.

Here is a considerably simplified summary of Rutherford's account; In Leibniz's mature philosophy physical laws represent the effects of the derivative forces of bodies. The derivative forces of bodies, in turn, are grounded in the primitive forces/powers of immaterial mind-like substances. So physical laws presuppose powers. But powers, according to Rutherford, equally presuppose laws. He suggests that there are two ways in which powers presuppose laws. First, each substance has an internal developmental law -- a "law of the series," as Leibniz calls it -- that specifies all of the successive states produced by the substance's primitive force (all of a substance's non-miraculous states are produced by its primitive force, according to Leibniz). But what exactly does the law of the series explain? According to Rutherford it plays a crucial role in accounting for the temporal endurance of a substance, and it also helps to explain the sense in which the nature of a substance is "complete" (it involves a complete history of a substance's states, which serves to distinguish it from every other actual or possible substance).

What the law of the series does not explain, however, is why the states of a substance develop in the particular way that they do. Put slightly differently, the law of the series does not render a simple substance's transitions from state to state intelligible as instances of natural change. This is because a substance's law of the series cannot be grasped by a finite mind, and because, being unique to a particular substance, it lacks the sort of generality that is required for making something intelligible as an instance of natural change. This brings us to the second way in which powers presuppose laws. Rutherford provocatively suggests that it is the physical laws of nature that explain the progression of a monad's perceptions. Although the substance's primitive force is the power that produces its successive states, it is the physical laws of nature -- capable of being grasped by a finite mind -- that render a monad's succession of states intelligible as an instance of natural change.

In "Change in the Monad," Martha Bolton also focuses on the order that obtains among the successive states of a Leibnizian monad. Leibniz claims that the only modifications that a monad possesses are perceptions and appetitions. But what exactly are perceptions and appetitions, and how are they related? More specifically, are perceptions essentially cognitive, and are appetitions essentially desire-like? Using systematic, historical, and contemporary resources, Bolton argues that both of these questions should be answered affirmatively. She suggests that we should see Leibniz as endorsing a broadly Aristotelian-Thomistic account of the relation between perception, appetition, and acting in a monad. Each monad has perceptual states that represent the value of future events. These cognitive representations give rise to desire-like appetitions to attain the things that are represented as attainable things of value. The desire-like appetitions, in turn, explain why monads act.

Some recent commentators have argued that Leibniz cannot be committed to the view that all appetitions are desire-like; if they were all akin to desires, then Leibniz would be unable to explain cases such as Bayle's dog. In Bayle's example, a dog is happily eating a bone when a man sneaks up behind it and hits it on the back with a stick. In this case the soul of the dog moves from a state of pleasure to a state of pain. Given Leibniz's doctrine of spontaneity, it must be in virtue of the soul's own appetites that it moves to the painful state. But surely the soul of the dog does not desire the state of pain! This has led some commentators to distinguish between desire-like appetites and appetites that are directed to ends that are good but are not represented as good or desired by the soul. Bolton, in contrast, provides a sophisticated account of the mechanism of appetition that allows Leibniz to resolve the problem of Bayle's dog while retaining the view that all appetitions are desire-like. Bolton argues that her analysis of the problem of Bayle's dog is to be preferred because it allows Leibniz to provide a univocal account of final causation that applies to every change within a monad (a view that is suggested in a number of texts), and because it allows Leibniz to maintain the Aristotelian-Thomistic explanatory model of the relation between perception, appetition, and action. This explanatory model, in turn, provides an intelligible account of the unity of all of a monad's actions.

In summary, I highly recommend this book. It is must-read material for scholars of modern philosophy, and it should be attractive to anyone who is interested in the history of philosophy.

I would like to thank Georgette Sinkler for several very helpful discussions of some of the essays included in the volume, particularly on the essay on Maimonides.