The Domestication of Derrida: Rorty, Pragmatism and Deconstruction

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Lorenzo Fabbri, The Domestication of Derrida: Rorty, Pragmatism and Deconstruction, Continuum, 2008, 150pp., $130.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780826497789.

Reviewed by Elizabeth A. Sperry, William Jewell College


Profound disagreement can be more comfortable for interested parties than a family resemblance between broadly similar approaches. Where there is a shared bloodline, more complete alignment seems within reach, if only the other side would wise up on a few details. Derrida and Rorty are just such philosophical siblings. Each appreciated the other, but expressed puzzlement at aspects of the other's work. The puzzlement was all the more vexing because seemingly irresolvable, despite Derrida's and Rorty's shared project of questioning philosophical absolutes.

Lorenzo Fabbri passes judgment on this scene of sibling strife in The Domestication of Derrida: Rorty, Pragmatism and Deconstruction. Adjudicating a dispute over fine points requires care: it demands an accurate portrayal of each account and a thoughtful sifting of differences. Unfortunately, Fabbri routinely fails to demonstrate such care. Nevertheless, The Domestication of Derrida may prove useful to some non-Continental philosophers, given its accessible treatment of Derrida. Juxtaposing Derrida and Rorty enables Fabbri to piggyback some of Derrida's ideas on Rorty's, a device that could be helpful to American readers already familiar with Rorty.

Fabbri sets himself three tasks: first, to explore areas of agreement between Derrida and Rorty; second, to present Rorty's failings as an interpreter of Derrida; and third, to expose Rorty's own philosophical shortcomings. Fabbri's title initially suggests a primary focus on Derrida, but in fact Fabbri is largely occupied with assessing Rorty. This is no bait and switch: it makes perfect sense given Derrida's and Rorty's overlapping intellectual territory.

Fabbri writes in a continental style, as befits a monograph in the Continuum Studies in Continental Philosophy Series. While pursuing his three aims, Fabbri expostulates on Benjamin, Harold Bloom, De Man, Foucault, Habermas, Hegel, Heidegger, Husserl, Kant, and Nietzsche. Analytic philosophers might consider these discussions to be unfocussed digressions; continental philosophers may see them as interesting intellectual back-story. Still, it is surprising that a book announcing Rorty's shortcomings finds so much time and space for so many other thinkers, when so little time and space is devoted to independent textual analysis of Rorty's oeuvre.

Fabbri explains that as an undergraduate he found "Rorty's interpretation of deconstruction fundamental for orienting me in Derrida's apparently senseless writing" (Fabbri, 1). Derrida, like Rorty, denies that we ever "meet the pure world" (Fabbri, 29). Instead, for Derrida, all attempts to refer to reality are already structured in advance by the workings of our language. Even one's self is partially constituted by others' language. Deconstruction aims to show the instability of this language and of the metaphysics it instantiates by "exhibit[ing] its own impropriety and non-independence" (Fabbri, 35).

Despite Rorty's value as a first approximation to Derrida, Fabbri ultimately finds Rorty's approach to Derrida flawed. In a passage that also provides a sense of his rhetorical approach, Fabbri writes that Rorty tries to "domesticate Derrida and to make him pacific, restrained, inoffensive. To turn a monster into a pet. A puppy." (Fabbri, 126) This "domestication" has two fronts: Rorty interprets Derrida as anti-metaphysical, and Rorty limits Derrida's work to the private sphere, despite deconstruction's political intent. Rorty ought instead to have read Derrida as using metaphysics to challenge metaphysics from within, and as an active political agent undermining concepts that support state power.

Rorty misrepresents Derrida, on Fabbri's view, but he also advocates terminally flawed positions of his own. Metaphysically, Fabbri explains, Rorty is self-referentially incoherent; politically, his views are abhorrent. Hence Rorty's own flaws connect with his presentation of Derrida: he sees Derrida as metaphysical because he cannot think clearly about the metaphysical, and he sees Derrida as apolitical because his neopragmatism is apolitical.

Despite family resemblances, there are important differences between Derrida's and Rorty's handlings of metaphysics and of the relationship between philosophy and politics. Fabbri's book, however, ignores the conceptual reasons for these differences, so that his analyses often turn on equivocation. This difficulty is particularly apparent in Fabbri's treatment of the metaphysical question.

When Rorty attacks metaphysics, he is trying to understand human experience without the intellectual backdrop originally provided by Greek philosophy, particularly its notion that we can know intrinsic natures of things. Relieved of traditional essentialism, truth and rationality reduce to workability and usefulness, and no longer purport to mirror reality. We continue to speak of everyday objects, but no longer believe ourselves to have plumbed their eternal natures.

Derrida's attack on metaphysics, on the other hand, references a broader and more pervasive problematic: the very words we use commit us to a way of understanding the world, a way of understanding which we cannot evade except at the cost of abandoning language altogether. Language itself is irreducibly metaphysical. Our vocabulary imports its own presuppositions, meaning that any talk of everyday objects shapes our orientation toward those objects. Since we cannot do without language for very long, and certainly cannot do without language in philosophical and literary analysis, we must retain our language -- and hence our metaphysics -- while interrogating it on its own terms. This is a vexed strategy, but there are no alternatives.

The distinction between Derridean and Rortyian "metaphysics" is problematic for Fabbri, because he shows no evidence of having noticed it. If one assumes the Derridean concept, Rorty's work will appear incoherent, because Rorty aims to eliminate metaphysics. For Derrida, eliminating metaphysics would entail eliminating language, but Rorty continues his language use.

Fabbri considers Rorty a stealth metaphysician. Rorty is ultimately a metaphysician because he seeks an underlying reality (Fabbri, 67), and because he "is incapable of avoiding a hidden reference to something extratextual … power, or coherence" (Fabbri, 64). But if assessing the workability, usefulness, power, and coherence of our ideas renders them metaphysical, this is not immediately apparent simply because these criteria are "extratextual." Fabbri must provide an argument. He fails to do so because he assumes the Derridean conception of all language as irreducibly metaphysical, and hence begs the question against the different, Rortyian notion of metaphysics as essentialism.

Fabbri has not only misunderstood Rorty; he has also missed an opportunity to consider the relative merits of alternative postmodernisms. But pursuing this opportunity would require first giving each alternative its interpretive due. Had Fabbri properly assessed Rorty's attack on metaphysics, he might have been able to explore the comparative merits of Rortyian non-essentialism and Derridean self-interrogating metaphysics, and perhaps even mounted a credible argument favoring the Derridean strategy.

A similar difficulty arises in Fabbri's account of the Derridean and Rortyian approach to political action. Derrida, as Fabbri explains, works to change the vocabulary that makes us overly comfortable with continued human suffering, a project I will label philosophical politics. Rorty argues, especially in Achieving Our Country, for the importance of working directly to alleviate human suffering, a project we could call active politics. A careful reading of Rorty's work shows that he does not denigrate philosophical politics in its own right; it is a project he engages in himself, and appreciates in Derrida (see "Habermas, Derrida, and Philosophy," where Rorty approves of Derrida's usefulness for showing "how the creation of new discourses can enlarge the realm of possibility." Truth and Progress, 310). But Rorty does disparage any pretensions on the part of philosophical politics to constitute active politics, particularly where philosophical politics becomes an impediment to active politics (see Achieving Our Country 14, 37, 78, and 96-7). Why? Because the most immediate need of the starving, the tortured, and the oppressed is for food, for peace, and for justice. Philosophy may ultimately conduce to the provision of food, peace, and justice, but it is not food or justice. This is why Rorty says of Derrida that he does "little to justify the choice of such a utopia or to hasten its arrival" ("Habermas, Derrida, and Philosophy," Truth and Progress, 310).

Accordingly, there is legitimate disagreement between Rorty and Derrida concerning the value of philosophical politics, and careful consideration of this disagreement requires an understanding of Rorty's actual views. It does not help simply to accuse Rorty of expecting "too little politics from Derrida" (Fabbri, 51) without noting Rorty's argument for a distinction between active and philosophical politics. The distinction has at least prima facie merit, but Fabbri does not see it. In fact, he claims Derrida does "philosophy as a political practice of civil disobedience" (Fabbri, 99). I agree with Fabbri that philosophy can be powerful, but I cannot see how to equate it with blocking the streets.

Unhappily, Fabbri's failure to consider thoughtfully the implications of disagreements between Derrida and Rorty is not the central problem with The Domestication of Derrida. The central problem, instead, is that Fabbri consistently upbraids Rorty for views Rorty does not hold. Probably the most stunning instance of misinterpretation in this book is Fabbri's contention that Rorty favors near-fascism to suppress social critique. Fabbri writes that "Rorty clearly asserts the possibility of resorting to violence to eradicate the philosophical threats to democracy" (Fabbri, 123) and that "Rorty does not hesitate to summon the brutal intervention of the police to enforce the social status quo" (125). Fabbri bases these claims on a passage in Rorty's "The Priority of Democracy to Philosophy." In that passage, Rorty says that a liberal democracy "will use force against the individual conscience, just insofar as conscience leads individuals to act so as to threaten democratic institutions" (Objectivity, Relativism, and Truth, 183). Fabbri ought to be aware that Rorty argues throughout his corpus in favor of free, unfettered society-wide discussion as a prerequisite for social and conceptual progress. Fabbri also ought to have understood that this passage is about the Unabomber and his ilk: they must be restrained if the rest of us are to be able to go about our lives. Fabbri simply assumes that by "threats to democratic institutions" Rorty understands "open discussion" as a threat, when Rorty's real concern is preventing acts of violence that make open discussion impossible.

Nearly as egregious is Fabbri's contention that Rorty does not care to "desubjugate" minorities (Fabbri, 116) and wishes instead to leave the dispossessed in conditions of oppression. Fabbri claims Rorty maintains that "We can survive only by forbidding the Third World's inhabitants all the comforts we enjoy… . There is no reason for him to care about the 'not-we'" (Fabbri, 119). Again, this ignores Rorty's repeated calls to "imagine [ourselves] in the shoes of the despised and the oppressed" ("Human Rights, Rationality, and Sentimentality," Truth and Progress, 179) and to "stay on the lookout for marginalized people -- people whom we still instinctively think of as 'they' rather than 'us'" ("Solidarity," Contingency, Irony, and Solidarity, 196). Rorty explicitly exhorts Western democracies to expand our sense of "we" so that we begin to care for the needs of people beyond those we have considered thus far.

Fabbri makes other blunders of this sort. For instance, he claims that Rorty, the author of "The Contingency of Language," "The Contingency of Selfhood," and "The Contingency of a Liberal Community" (all in Contingency, Irony, and Solidarity), opposes a focus on "the radical contingency of the current now" (Fabbri, 118). He attributes to Rorty a "ban" " (Fabbri, 117) on non-intellectuals assessing their own social shaping. (Rorty imagines a descriptive scenario in which non-intellectuals are "commonsensically nominalist and historicist" without caring to pursue further philosophical inquiry, but nowhere suggests the scenario is prescriptive. See "Private Irony and Liberal Hope," Contingency, Irony, and Solidarity, 87.) As before, Fabbri's claims are enabled by readings that take Rorty's sentences out of their original context, and isolate them from his persistently stated themes. It is unfortunate that such hermeneutic irresponsibility occurs in a book hoping to show that Rorty's use of Derrida rests on a misinterpretation.

Is language itself ineradicably metaphysical, or can it be pragmatically repurposed without an essentialistic foundation? Do we make concrete, political improvements in our lives when we destabilize the language in which we understand ourselves, or do we merely clear the way for subsequent concrete, political improvements? These questions are not so oppositional as the choice between, say, Platonism and postmodernism. But for anyone interested in postmodern theorizing, they are important questions nonetheless. Family disputes are best resolved with careful attention to the legitimate claims of all parties. Readers in search of such an approach are advised to look beyond The Domestication of Derrida.