The Early Modern Subject: Self-Consciousness and Personal Identity from Descartes to Hume

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Udo Thiel, The Early Modern Subject: Self-Consciousness and Personal Identity from Descartes to Hume, Oxford University Press, 2011, 483pp., $110.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780199542499.

Reviewed by Marleen Rozemond, University of Toronto


This book discusses self-consciousness and personal identity in a wide range of early modern philosophers. It is clearly and engagingly written. The book is easily accessible to non-specialists and has a lot to offer to specialists, in particular on account of its extensive coverage of thinkers other than the usual suspects. Thiel begins with an introduction that offers some pre-modern background and then turns to the period itself. The book's central figure is Locke, on whom Thiel has published extensively before. Thiel devotes two chapters to Locke and two chapters to criticisms of Locke from thinkers in the period. The most prominent other figures he discusses include Descartes and Spinoza (a short discussion), Leibniz and Wolff (a longer discussion), and Hume (two chapters).

The book stands out for extensive discussion of less prominent figures in the period. Some of these are not part of the traditional canonical list but are familiar to specialists in the field at least: various Cartesians (such as Arnauld and La Forge), Cudworth, Pufendorf, Anthony Collins, Samuel Clarke, Butler, Reid, Jonathan Edwards. But Thiel also discusses a number of almost unknown thinkers, in particular from the British Isles but also from France and Germany. For instance, Thiel discusses a debate between two English theologians, William Sherlock and Robert South, that he sees as particularly relevant to Locke (pp. 54-60) and a number of followers and critics of Locke. While Thiel engages in various interpretative controversies, and does so more than other authors covering such a large number of thinkers, his book's scope does not allow for real in-depth discussion of specific texts or issues.

Thiel's attention to less prominent thinkers has a payoff for the topic of consciousness: these thinkers were sometimes more explicit about the issue than were the canonical figures. His treatment brings out one important feature that is standard in the period: consciousness in this period is always self-consciousness in the sense of consciousness of one's mental states. There is no reference to our modern notion of the qualitative "what it's like", raising questions about how these two ideas should be related. A question he raises throughout the book is whether consciousness was seen as a second-order act distinct from the mental state it is about, or as part of the original mental state. A related question is whether the subject is conscious of all its mental states. If so, as Descartes held, then there is a risk of an infinite regress, a risk that was sometimes articulated in the period, for instance, by Spinoza and Leibniz. Concerning some thinkers Thiel writes that it is not clear whether they saw consciousness as a separate act or not. Thiel argues that Locke did not do so, Leibniz did, and while he sees Descartes as a difficult case, he concludes that Descartes did as well.

On the topic of personal identity, Locke's discussion is central. Thiel explains how before the early modern period there were two notions of person: a metaphysical one articulated in particular by Boethius (person as an "individual substance of a rational nature"), and the conception of a person as a role or function that can be found, for instance, in Cicero (pp. 26-30). Both uses of the term can be found in the early modern period. And when used in the Boethian sense, some held that the person is the soul, others the body-soul composite. The topic of personal identity is not, however, always discussed (by Thiel or his subjects) using the term 'person'. Sometimes Thiel uses the more neutral term 'human subject'. Descartes applies the term 'person' to the mind-body composite, but the soul is what can survive the death of the body and gives us, as Descartes put it, hope of an afterlife. Subsequently Thiel refers to the view that personal identity consists in identity of the soul as the Cartesian view (e.g., p. 270). Other views include the view that personal identity consists in identity of body plus soul -- in this case difficult questions arise about the identity of the body over time -- or views like Locke's that it is constituted by consciousness. Thiel's treatment very usefully connects the issue of personal identity to various issues that nowadays do not necessarily surface in connection to this topic: the notion of moral or legal responsibility; the importance of memory to responsibility; the importance of the afterlife, the resurrection of the body, the persons of the Trinity.

Thiel does not offer a sustained argument for a temporal development over the course of the period, but he does suggest that there were various trends. He writes that during the Middle Ages, philosophers frequently discussed the topic of individuation at a time, but during the early modern period this topic became superseded by the issue of identity over time (p. 23). Connected with this, Thiel sees a trend towards subjectivist treatments of identity, a treatment that relates identity to our concepts, while at the same time an ontological approach continued to be present (p. 72).

Thiel's discussion of the debates that followed Locke's account is very interesting. The period comes to life with its energetic debates about the pros and cons of Locke's account, including discussion of the circularity and transitivity objections. Thiel takes a stance in various interpretative debates. He argues against the view that consciousness is the same as reflection for Locke. He discusses how Locke ties his discussion of identity to the use of concepts: we can't ask whether something is the same thing over time without specifying what concept we are using. Are we asking whether it is the same body or the same living thing? The same man or the same person? Thiel argues that Locke's notion of identity is subjectivist in this sense and criticizes the view that Locke held that at a particular time there are several things that coincide, for instance, a person and a man (pp. 107-109).

Thiel discusses questions of influence. He argues against the view that Locke was influenced by Stoic discussions. He does, however, see the debate between Sherlock and South as relevant to Locke. Sherlock argued that consciousness constitutes the identity of a spirit, thus partly agreeing with Locke (p. 55). Thiel argues that Locke had formulated his own version of this view before he read this debate, but that Locke's development of the view may have owed something to the debate. In particular, the debate included discussion of the circularity objection, and so Thiel suggests that Locke was aware of this objection.

Locke's view was revolutionary in its claim that personal identity consists in sameness of consciousness. Thiel argues against the common interpretation of Locke's account of personal identity as a pure memory account (pp. 121-126). Locke defended his view on the ground of his analysis of personhood in terms of consciousness. Hence, he argues, sameness of consciousness is required for personal identity but not sameness of substance (body or soul). He then argued, in particular about spiritual substance, that we simply do not know enough about substance and about the possibility of transmission of consciousness from one substance to another to rule out the possibility that sameness of consciousness may not coincide with sameness of substance (Essay II.xxvii.13). Thiel makes the interesting further claim that this agnosticism was Locke's ground for locating the identity of the human subject in the person rather than the soul, but he does so without argument (p. 120).

This agnosticism is an important feature of Locke's thought, also in regard to his very controversial views about the possibility of thinking matter. It would have been interesting to see more discussion of this aspect of Locke's view. In his discussion of responses to Locke, Thiel systematically examines the views of different philosophers about the notion of the person. But there is relatively little discussion of Locke's striking agnosticism. Did later thinkers not discuss this idea? It certainly seems to be an important point in Leibniz's criticisms of Locke in regard to the possibility of thinking matter. Leibniz held that we can see that thinking can't belong to matter, and relies on a more optimistic view of our grasp of substance, the nature of matter and thought.[1]

The other philosopher Thiel gives extensive attention to is Hume, in two chapters. Among other things, Thiel discusses at length the question whether Hume's bundle view was anticipated by various other thinkers, and argues that this is not the case. He discusses remarks in Books II and III of the Treatise where a different, lesser-known notion of personal identity seems to emerge, personal identity "as it regards our passions or the concern we take in ourselves", and which involves the body. Thiel argues that this notion is consistent, however, with the one found in Book I. In addition, he argues that Hume's bundle view of the self is not the whole story. Rather, the bundle of perceptions is all we have epistemic access to (p. 418). But Hume does not deny the existence of a self beyond the bundle. Thiel does not, however, resolve the problem that Hume himself sometimes describes the self as just a bundle without seeming to limit himself to claims about what we have epistemic access to (p. 420).

Thiel has read widely in the secondary literature, although there are some surprising omissions from the references. In his discussion of Leibniz he never refers to Robert Adams's classic and important book on Leibniz,[2] and in his discussion of Leibniz's conception of substance he omits reference to Sleigh's marvelous treatment of that topic, although he does refer to Sleigh elsewhere.

While a strength of Thiel's book is its impressive range, detailed analysis of the texts of individual thinkers and specific issues pays the price. One puzzling issue is this. In the introduction Thiel writes that nominalists in the medieval tradition were not troubled by the problem of individuation, that is, by the question what explains that there is a number of individuals within a kind (p. 21). Most notably Ockham, Thiel writes, thought that there was no need to search for a principle of individuation; the individuality of things is primitive. Later Thiel notes that Descartes fails to give an account of the individuality of the soul (p. 38). Descartes also does not provide an account of the identity of the soul over time. Thiel faults Descartes and others in the period on both scores. But Thiel does not seem to contemplate the possibility that these thinkers also thought there was no need for an account of the individuation of the soul.[3] Furthermore, they may have thought that there was no need for an account of the identity of the soul over time. Locke, who devoted such care to the issue of identity, passed over the identity over time of "spirits" very quickly indeed (Essay II.XXVII.2), and his discussion of identity suggests that he thought -- rather plausibly, it seems to me -- that only composite entities raise difficult issues in this regard. (This is assuming, as Thiel also does, that the question of what makes something the same over time is different from the question of how we can tell whether something remains the same over time. The latter may pose problems for the case of souls even if one thinks the former does not.)

On a different topic, Thiel rightly notes that it is not easy to determine whether for Descartes consciousness was first-order or second-order. The issue at stake is what Descartes has in mind when he defines thought in terms of consciousness: "By the term 'thought' I understand everything that we are conscious of as happening within us, in so far as we have consciousness of it" (Principles of Philosophy I.9). He is notoriously quiet about what he means by consciousness. Thiel favors the second-order view, on the basis of a passage from the conversation with Burman (pp. 47-48):

It is correct that to be conscious is both to think and to reflect on one's thought. But it is false that this reflection cannot occur while the previous thought is still there. This is so because . . . the soul is capable of thinking of more than one thing at the same time, and of continuing with a particular thought which it has. It has the power to reflect on its thoughts as often as it likes, and to be conscious of its thoughts in this way. (AT V 149; CSM III 335)[4]

There are two problems with this. First, Thiel does not take into account the fact that this was not a text written by Descartes himself, but an account of a conversation penned by Frans Burman. So the text should be handled with care. Furthermore, it simply does not look like Descartes is talking here about the notion of consciousness that occurs in his definitions of thought. Consciousness in that sense must be present in all thought. But Burman describes Descartes as presenting the kind of reflection on one's thought at issue in the conversation as optional: he writes that Descartes said we can reflect on our thoughts as often as we like. Thiel rightly criticizes some interpreters (Barth, Lähteenmäki) who offer useful discussions purported to be about consciousness in Descartes, but draw on a lot of texts that do not seem to explicate what Descartes himself calls consciousness, 'conscientia' (p. 49). They in fact provide a rich picture of knowledge of one's own mental states in Descartes that goes beyond that particular notion. But here something like the opposite problem arises: Burman uses the term 'consciousness', but given what he says about it, it seems seriously problematic that he is accurately reporting on Descartes's own notion of consciousness. Thiel's interpretation saddles Descartes with the regress problem. Thiel does make a proposal for solving the problem, but it is very puzzling. A more plausible solution to the regress is that for Descartes consciousness is not a distinct act, but an inherent feature of every mental act, as other interpreters Thiel cites (p. 46, n. 61) have argued.

Be that as it may, there is much to learn from this rich and informative book.

[1] See Leibniz' New Essays in C.I. Gerhardt: Die Philosophischen Schriften von G.W. Leibniz, (7 vols.), Hildesheim: Olms, 1978), vol. V, pp. 58-59. For a translation see Jonathan Bennett and Peter Remnant, New Essays on Human Understanding (Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 1981), p. 66.

[2] Robert M. Adams, Leibniz: Determinist, Theist, Idealist, Oxford University Press, 1994.

[3] For the view that Descartes saw individuation as primitive, see Calvin Normore, "Descartes and the Metaphysics of Extension", A Companion to Descartes, Janet Broughton and John Carriero, eds., Blackwell, 2008, pp. 271-287.

[4] References to Charles Adam and Paul Tannery eds., Œuvres de Descartes, 11 vols. (Paris: Vrin, 1996) (AT). For translations, see John Cottingham, Robert Stoothoff and Dugald Murdoch eds., The Philosophical Writings of Descartes, 3 vols. (Cambridge: Cambridge University Press 1985-1991) (CSM).