The Elements and Patterns of Being: Essays in Metaphysics

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D. C. Williams, The Elements and Patterns of Being: Essays in Metaphysics, A. R. J. Fisher (ed.), Oxford University Press, 2018, 239pp., $67.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780198810384.

Reviewed by Anna-Sofia Maurin, University of Gothenburg


Donald Cary Williams studied at Harvard, where he received his PhD in 1924. After a stint at UCLA (1930-1939), he went on to spend the majority of his pre-retirement work-life at his alma mater (1939-1967). In spite of the fact that most of his active career took place in an environment characterized by thoroughly anti-metaphysical, anti-realist sentiments, Williams persisted in promoting the sorts of theories popular before the age of ordinary language philosophy and logical positivism. He was a stern realist and a naturalist, convinced that we can know things about the (mind-independent) fundamental constituents of (spatiotemporal) reality. His preferred method was 'scientistic' in that he thought that the way we know these things is through induction coupled with inference to the best explanation. Indeed, Williams regarded metaphysics as the most empirical enterprise (concerned with, and hence answerable to, the existence and nature of everything). He also, famously, was a trope theorist (the first so called), a four-dimensionalist, and an actualist. As one of very few serious metaphysicians during the 30s-60s, Williams served as an inspiration for a more metaphysically minded generation to come. People he taught at Harvard included Roderick Chisholm in the 40s, Nicholas Wolterstorff in the 50s, and David Lewis in the 60s. His ideas also very much influenced people at the University of Sydney, including David Armstrong, John Bacon, and Keith Campbell. A. R. J. Fisher has collected twelve of Williams' papers, half of which are previously unpublished (selected by Fisher from the Donald Cary Williams papers and published with the permission of Williams' son, David C. Williams). In so doing, he has done (the history of) analytic metaphysics a great service. Although demonstrably important to the way twentieth century metaphysics developed, Williams has not yet received quite the acknowledgment one would expect. This, Fisher speculates in the volume's very helpful introduction, is at least in part due to the fact that his collected work is now mostly "scattered in journals, hard-to-find anthologies and out-of-print books" (p. vii) or -- as witnessed by half of the texts in this volume -- was never published in the first place.

Williams had plans to write a book; a systematic treatise synthesizing his views on ontology and methodology, including his views on tropes, universals, the nature of time, and the possibility of time travel. Several of the previously unpublished papers collected in this volume were written with the intention of being included in that book (which may explain why they were never published elsewhere). That book was never finished, which means that this volume offers its reader the second best thing: the contours of the systematic theory Williams had in mind. A (partial) map to how it all 'hangs together'.

In the volume's first paper (previously unpublished "The Duty of Philosophy") Williams distinguishes between two sorts of philosophical enterprises -- cosmology and ontology -- and two modes of inquiry -- the speculative and the analytical -- into either. In doing cosmology, first, one departs from all evidence provided by common sense, science, and religion, considered collectively, and then proceeds to construct as coherent and complete an account as possible, fitting those pieces together. In ontology, one rather considers 'everything' distributively. Although it seems natural to think of cosmology as primarily speculative, and ontology as (perhaps only) analytic, Williams insists that his is a fourfold distinction. In practice, however, the distinction foremost in his mind seems to have been that between Speculative Cosmology and Analytic Ontology. Among these, Williams seems to consider Analytic Ontology the more fundamental sort of inquiry. For, he points out: "The mere cosmologist who accepts the alphabet of ideas current within the day's science and common sense can spell out nothing better than a miscellaneous encyclopedia of informations" (p. 20). To go deeper we must go ontological and analytical. For the Analytic Ontologist doesn't just try to fit the information given to us in common sense and science into a coherent picture, but asks about whatever those theories posit: what is it? In the analytic mode, the answer is either a straightforward clarification of the concepts, or, if it is deemed necessary, a substitution of those concepts by new more apt ones. Hence, "it will be one of our lessons that wholes are in a fundamental regard subsequent to their components, and that the analytic procedure which distinguishes parts has just the corresponding priority" (p. 23).

Just as philosophy can in this way be subdivided into two 'parts', so can this book. Hence, the first consists of papers mainly concerned with issues --tropes, universals, objects, and, in general, the fundamental constituents of reality and the things they make up -- in Analytic Ontology, and the second of papers -- primarily to do with the nature of time and related issues -- in Speculative Cosmology. "The Duty of Philosophy" serves as an informative backdrop to both kinds of investigation. This text was originally intended as the introduction to Williams' never published book, but manages just as well as the introduction to this collection. Apart from distinguishing Analytic Ontology from Speculative Cosmology, it presents and defends some of Williams' most fundamental framework assumptions, including his scientific realism, his naturalism and his empiricism. The picture he paints here is instructive, making good sense of the many methodological remarks one finds scattered in Williams' published work (also helpful in this regard is -- likewise previously unpublished -- "How Reality is Reasonable").

Williams' most influential text in Analytic Ontology is "On the Elements of Being" (first published 1953). This text was originally published in two parts, the second of which has so far been much less read than the first (possibly because only the first part of the paper was published more recently in Mellor and Oliver's Properties, 1997). Fisher has opted for merging the two papers into one. This is a good decision, as some common misunderstandings of things said in the first part of the paper may be due to people not being sufficiently familiar with the second. In this paper, Williams defends a one-category theory of tropes, a resemblance class theory of universals, and a bundle theory of concrete particulars. Tropes, he argues, are 'abstract particulars', meaning that they -- in being particular -- do not obey the identity of indiscernibles, and that they -- in being abstract -- are "partial, incomplete or fragmentary" (p. 33). Especially Williams' discussion of the sense in which tropes are (as well as the many senses in which they are not) abstract is illuminating (cf. also his "Universals and Existents" on this topic). As more or less all of the theses are now held by proponents of the 'standard' view of tropes, the influence it has had on subsequent discussions can hardly be exaggerated.

Unfortunately, the same cannot be said of some of Williams' other texts in Analytic Ontology. As a consequence, the contemporary debate on tropes has e.g., mostly failed to take into account his more mature views on the nature of universals. These he sets out in "Universals and Existents" (written 1960, but not published until 1986 -- then thanks to Lewis), "Universal Concepts and Particular Processes" (previously unpublished, but written around 1962, when it was read at the Philosophy Club of Boston University), and "Necessary Facts" (published 1963). In "On the Elements of Being", Williams had argued that 'universals' are really exact resemblance classes of tropes. This view he now rejects "on the . . . unfashionable ground that the set of tropes is not what I or any of the rest of us mean by 'the universal character Humanness'" (p. 58). Rather, when we speak of universals, we either refer to the trope of an object and say of it, this trope is an F, or we refer to the trope and say of it, this is F-ness. That is, we either attribute a universal to the trope, or we identify the trope with the universal. The best explanation of this state of affairs, according to Williams, is as follows: there are two senses of identity, one strict and one weaker, and when we identify the trope with the universal, what we are doing is applying the weaker sense of identity to it (a sense on which indiscernibility implies identity). Universals are hence not "made or discovered but are, as it were, 'acknowledged' by a relaxation of identity conditions of thought and language" (p. 59). From this fact, it does not follow that universals have an "inferior or diluted reality" (p. 60). Rather, Williams explains, "A tabulation of universals is just one way of counting, as it were, the same world which is counted, in a legitimately different and more discriminating way, in a tabulation of particulars" (p. 60). In "Universal Concepts and Particular Processes", Williams then ties this (new) theory of universals to the issue of how our concepts connect with the reality they are about. The point of departure is a supposed mystery: how can our concepts -- abstract, general and eternal as they are -- relate to the contingent, actual, particular and concrete content of the universe? Given that the difference between a trope and a universal is the mode of attention which singles each out, this mystery dissolves, according to Williams. For,

The process [of going from universal to particular or from particular to universal] is as easy as going to sleep, which it somewhat resembles, since it is simply a failure or refusal to discriminate in one of the two dimensions, difference of case and difference of kind, which cosmic abundance provides for, and . . . proceeding for the moment as if distinction of kind were the sufficient or only distinction. (p. 71)

As mentioned, the second half of the book is almost exclusively devoted to Williams' discussions of the nature of time, and of the possibility of time travel. Of these five papers, three -- "The Nature of Time" (1966), "The Shape of Time" (1968), and "The Bugbear of Fate" (1974) -- are previously unpublished, and two -- "The Sea Fight Tomorrow" (1951) and "The Myth of Passage" (1951) -- are not only published, but rightly considered classics in the field. The main goal in all of these texts is to defend Williams' four-dimensionalism -- 'the pure manifold theory' as he calls it -- from two sorts of criticism: (i) that it implies an implausible form of fatalism, and (ii) that it cannot make sense of the felt 'flux' or 'passage' of time. With respect to the first of these criticisms (first discussed by Aristotle in De Interpretatione 9.18a28-b19), Williams argues that it rests on the mistaken view that, if it is determined that x, then x will occur no matter what. But this overlooks a central distinction: that between being determined (i.e., necessitated in some way) and being determinate (i.e., to exist and be "definite or completely characterized" (p. 148)). "Events cannot be determined without being determinate/ . . . / But events can be determinate without being determined" (p. 148). That future events are determinate is hence compatible with their being caused by our actions, and whether or not every event is fixed also in the sense that it is wholly caused by some physical circumstance, going back to 'the beginning' is another matter, and one on which four-dimensionalism itself remains neutral.

With respect to the charge that four-dimensionalism lacks the resources to make sense of the felt 'flux' or 'passage' of time, Williams does not -- as one might perhaps expect -- simply dismiss those feelings as 'mere appearance'. He rather takes them very seriously, yet insists that his four-dimensionalism can make room for them. What is this 'passage', then? One way of understanding it is as a sort of 'motion' in time. But 'motion', Williams points out, already has an explanation in the four dimensions: it is the presence of the same individual at different places at different times. Thus understood, there is passage, "but it is nothing extra" (p. 164). This is a good thing, for if it were something extra, i.e., if on top of this down-to-earth 'motion' in space-time, there was passage or motion of time, this would lead to trouble. For, Williams argues, if time moves, it moves at a certain rate, which means that there must be a time for it to move 'in'. And if this further time also moves (which it probably does, as proponents of the passage of time tend to think that 'passage' is essential to time), and if it moves at a certain rate, it too will require time to move in. And so on, ad infinitum.

What about the direction, 'sense', or 'arrow' of time? That things exist at more than one date in the temporal dimension does not immediately make sense of this. Williams suggests that the direction of time is something generated by relations other than, but in, this dimension. Entropy is a commonly suggested candidate for that role, but Williams suspects that, in the end, the direction of time will depend on entities on a much finer scale, like "minute asymmetrical processes on the level of the electrons, or lower" (p. 177). One consequence of having time's direction depend on the direction of relations distinct from time (rather than the other way around) is that, if the direction of (some of) these relations could be reversed, time travel would be in principle possible. In "The Bugbear of Fate", Williams asks if the possibility of this type of time-travel could be turned into an argument against fatalism about the past. According to Williams, it could. For, if time travel is possible, someone from the future could go back to the past and cause something to happen. Note, though, that this does not mean that she could go back and in any way change the past. For, "The history of the period happened only once, the time traveler's arrival there and then happened only once, a long while ago, and it never unhappened or happened over in a different way" (p. 224). In this sense, the past and the future are the same: "We cannot change what the history of the future is actually going to be, but we can by our efforts make it different from what it would otherwise have been" (p. 224).

This is a great collection of papers by a fascinating and so far underappreciated philosopher. Here I have only managed to highlight a fraction of the themes discussed in it but, hopefully, what I have managed to touch upon has been enough to convince you of its great value. I recommend this book to anyone interested in issues to do with method in metaphysics, tropes, four-dimensionalism, time travel, D. C. Williams, or, for that matter the more recent history of analytic philosophy.


Mellor, D. H. & A. Oliver, eds., 1997, Properties, Oxford: Oxford University Press