The Elusiveness of the Ordinary: Studies in the Possibility of Philosophy

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Rosen, Stanley, The Elusiveness of the Ordinary: Studies in the Possibility of Philosophy, Yale University Press, 2002, 327pp, $37.50 (hbk), ISBN 0300091974.

Reviewed by Richard Eldridge, Swarthmore College


Well on in Joseph Conrad’s Lord Jim, Marlow consults the German expatriate trader Stein about Jim’s case. Stein offers these thoughts:

Yes! Very funny this terrible thing is. A man that is born falls into a dream like a man who falls into the sea. If he tries to climb out into the air as inexperienced people endeavour to do, he drowns—nicht war? … No! I tell you! The way is to the destructive element submit yourself, and with the exertions of your hands and feet in the water make the deep, deep sea keep you up.

Something like Stein’s attitude is the dominant theme of Stanley Rosen’s new book. “We have,” Rosen worries, “either lost touch with or become detached from ordinary experience… The pursuit of the ordinary is a sign of decadence, not of simplicity” (p. 5). It is not clear that ordinary experience is either quite wholly available to us or quite wholly coherent, yet it is all around us, and nothing else can serve as the point of departure for the exertions of the philosopher. Rosen understands doing philosophy to involve an ‘erotic’ effort to “keep oneself up” from within the ordinary.

Various other philosophers have of course held quite different conceptions of philosophy, including conceiving of philosophy as a strict science, or as a transcendental investigation of underlying “conditions of the possibility” of the ordinary, or as an embrace of a coherent ordinary life, in such a way that philosophical desire is stilled. Rosen develops his own conception of philosophy by describing and criticizing these alternative conceptions, each of which—he argues—involves either denying or inappropriately resolving what Rosen himself sees as a standing tension between ordinary life and philosophical desire and thought.

As envisioners of a strict science of ordinary life and human experience, Rosen considers first Montesquieu and then Husserl. Montesquieu in The Spirit of Laws is described as a founder father of the modern mathematical social sciences that fail really to grasp the basis and meaning of human, political life. Montesquieu, according to Rosen, holds both (a) that human beings have innate traits, as a result of which their actions fall under laws that are analogous to the laws of Newtonian mechanics, and (b) that human beings are free to deviate from these laws. This incoherent stance indicates that Montesquieu has failed to grasp exactly how human nature is expressed in political practice. No coherent political science can result from commitment to both (a) and (b). “The substitution of Cartesian or Newtonian for Aristotelian physics radicalizes the problem, already visible in Aristotle, of the natural basis for politics” (p. 51). We are worse off, according to Rosen, when we face this unavoidable, even unsolvable problem by conceiving of human nature (as Montesquieu undertook to do) along the lines of Cartesian-Newtonian material nature, where material bodies fall under exceptionless laws. First, we are just not like that in our actions, and, second, so conceiving of ourselves threatens to deprive us of all norms for political life. Perhaps we would be better off, at least in political philosophy, to hold to a Platonic-Aristotelian conception of even material nature. “The shift from construing nature as the ancient philosophies did to understanding it as do modern physicists deprives political philosophers of a standard by which to validate traditional or customary standards” (p. 25). Absent Platonic-Aristotelian conceptions of physical and human nature, we may be forced to see political life as either just ‘what simply happens’ or just what individuals wholly arbitrarily ‘choose to do’. Either way, compelling norms seem unavailable.

Husserl somewhat similarly undertook “to make philosophy truly scientific as well as to restore the human relevance of science” (p. 59). In pursuit of this aim, Husserl proposes a science of conceptual consciousness. He “demands that we see mentally the structures of subjectivity, but also that we see ourselves in the act of seeing” (p. 68). This effort, too, founders, in that it cannot take account of the erotic drive, arising mysteriously from within ordinary life, that alone can motivate scientific efforts. “It is innerworldly philosophical eros that drives one to phenomenology. But phenomenology depends upon the neutralization of innerworldly eros” (p. 88). Hence, though motivated by ordinary experience, it fails to grasp what goes on within ordinary experience.

The transcendental investigations of Kant and of Heidegger are likewise incoherently both rooted in ordinary life and dismissive of its significance. Kant, in describing the categorical imperative as a law of pure practical reason laid down within the structure of each deliberative consciousness, produces a moral theory that is “cut …off from the common moral understanding to which he initially appeals” (p. 117). Rosen concludes that Kant’s “desire to preserve freedom and morality was enacted in such a way as to accelerate the advent of antirationalism, or of spontaneity severed from law, and so the destruction of morality” (p. 116). Heidegger, too, incoherently repudiates ordinary, lived, deliberative experience. He proposes a “transformation of phronesis into fundamental ontology” (p. 120), but in doing so he “empties [phronesis] of all specific content” (p. 123).

Wittgenstein and Strauss attempted to put an end to philosophy: Wittgenstein by arguing that it is impossible and urging a “return to common speech” (p. 139); Strauss by arguing that philosophy is nothing more than knowledge of ignorance (p. 151). Neither stance is coherent, according to Rosen. Speech and concepts change in ordinary life, and we need to and can think about what to say and think. Simply to endorse one version of everyday language at a particular moment, as Rosen takes Wittgenstein to do, is already itself to do philosophy, not to put an end to it. Rosen criticizes Moore, Austin, and Grice similarly. Strauss’s practice of reading philosophical texts as themselves parables of our standing failure transparently to know absolutes fails itself to resolve the issue that we must face of whether revealed knowledge (religious or philosophical) is possible. In the quarrels between Athens and Jerusalem and between the ancients and the moderns, Strauss “never clearly identified the victors” (p. 158).

After rejecting the strategies of philosophy as science, philosophy as transcendental investigation, and of a return to the ordinary/acceptance of ignorance, Rosen turns to sketching his own metaphysics of ordinary experience and his own account of philosophy in relation to ordinary experience. His guiding thoughts here are that “we have to start with our vision of the world” (p. 201) and that “the program of philosophy …is to go beyond ordinary language, and to show how the ordinary develops into the extraordinary, not how the extraordinary collapses into the ordinary” (p. 203). His precursor heroes in this program are Plato and Aristotle, each of whom begins by talking about “unitary wholes” that are present in ordinary experience—this cow or that chair—and that are grasped by “seeing the looks” (p. 214) of things. But they do not stop with this thought. Instead, and moved, respectively, by philosophical eros and by a desire to know, Plato and Aristotle each go on to develop metaphysical accounts of what realities underlie unitary wholes and their looks.

Largely following Aristotle, Rosen himself endorses hylomorphism. The unitary wholes that we see are substances (space-occupying particulars) that are informed by a blueprint or model (essence). A cow, for example, is “a substance having an essence” (p. 280). In developing his hylomorphist metaphysics, Aristotle “straightens out” (p. 187) ordinary experience, therein showing us that a deeper, more insightful, more passionate stance toward it is possible, beyond simple acceptance. In moral and political philosophy, we can cultivate expert phronesis or practical wisdom in dealing with the things of ordinary experience, rather than either collapsing back into the way things are done or turning to pseudo-human sciences or moralities of pure ‘inner’ conscience. “Philosophy”—theoretical and practical—”is extraordinary, but the meaning of ‘extra’ is unintelligible in detachment from the word ‘ordinary’ that it modifies” (p. 303).

In developing both his criticisms of others and his own conception of philosophy as passionate, extraordinary thinking beginning from within the ordinary, Rosen has two main, interrelated concerns. He is worried about vulgarity, consumerism, and drift in modern life, and he is worried about the dominance of constructivism and technological-instrumental thinking in modern thought. His endeavor to call us back to a reflective mode of engagement with the ordinary is designed to address both these worries. Receptive engagement with the ordinary will rein in subjective-instrumental theorizing, making it responsible to something real; reflection on our engagements will pull us out of ordinary consumerism and toward something higher. These are interesting and important worries to address, both in doing philosophy and in thinking about how to do it. The problem of achieving intelligibility and genuine practical accessibility, on the one hand, along with exemplary pursuit of objective value, on the other, is genuine, both in thought and in life, and it is perhaps especially pressing in modernity.

Yet Rosen’s way of addressing this problem is not consistently successful or satisfying, in two closely related ways. First, his address to this problem remains on the whole too methodological, too concerned with how to get started in doing philosophy at all, rather than with particular problems of inquiry, ethics, politics, religion, or art. One wants to know more than one gets about exactly what epistemic, ethical, political, religious, or artistic stances, norms, or principles follow from actually practicing philosophy according to Rosen’s conception of it. The metaphysics that Rosen offers of unitary wholes and their looks is (as he would concede) compatible with any number of practices of inquiry, ethical life, political life, religious life, and practices of art. So exactly where—toward what specific fruitful engagements and orientations (other than a lot more worrying about how to do philosophy)—is Rosen pointing us? I am not clear that Rosen offers much of an answer.

Second, Rosen’s readings of the figures whom he criticizes are not as generous as they might be, particularly in failing to note how these figures did address substantive, particular problems. Recall, for example, that Rosen’s charge against Kant is that his moral theory is “cut … off from the common moral understanding to which he initially appeals” (p. 117)—as the sort of updated but unspecified phronesis that Rosen prefers presumably is not. But is this right? It is true that Kant claims that the categorical imperative is a self-legislated command of pure practical reason, laid down within each individual conscience. It is true that this command can, sometimes, call us to reject “the way things are done.” But is this command either empty of content (so that it encourages empty narcissism) or inaccessible from and inapplicable within ordinary life? Perhaps it is. But Rosen here does not stop to take account of the work of numbers of important recent commentators who have addressed these charges in detail, including Onora O’Neill, Christine Korsgaard, Barbara Herman, Marcia Baron, Paul Guyer, Richard Eldridge, and Felicitas Munzel, among others. It would have been good to know in particular what Rosen makes of Munzel’s elegant study, Kant’s Conception of Moral Character, given that Munzel traces Kant’s conception of an Umkehrung (reversal, transformation) in character that results in commitment to principle, against the grains of egoism and habit, as that Umkehrung may be nourished, but not controlled, from within ordinary educational and religious life.

Similarly, Rosen fails to take on the most powerful and persuasive readings of Wittgenstein and Austin that bring out their substantive commitments, preferring himself to focus instead on methodological issues alone. Here it is important that Wittgenstein worked specifically to challenge the intelligibility of representationalist conceptions of conceptual consciousness and understanding, so as to call into question all programs of scientistic or quasi-scientistic ‘research’ into the mind (as a container of representations), from Cartesianism to cognitive science to central state materialism. This work of Wittgenstein’s on clearing up our conceptions of human understanding and human life has clear consequences for inquiry (and for ethics—where we are pointed toward an investigation of ethical conversation and interaction, rather than toward ethical knowledge in individual minds). Wittgenstein’s work is not here either quietist or inconclusive. Rosen, however, remains silent about this. Likewise, Austin in writing on action explicitly set himself against (neo-Augustinian) conceptions of volition as an ‘inner act or event’ that might (or might not) accompany any particular bodily motion. Here Austin undertook to point us in the style of Aristotle and Hegel toward a conception of voluntary and responsible action as rooted in progressive, socially-enabled mastery of a style of intelligibility in one’s doings and of a language of assessment for them. This stance too has consequences for the philosophy of mind, for ethics, and for how we actually conduct ourselves in our courses of education and legal dispute.

Rosen’s work is always provocative, here so as much as ever. The worries that motivate it are significant. His own investigations of philosophical methodology are often eye-opening. Against a background of considerable learning, he has thought hard about what serious, passionate, orientation-seeking thinking might be or be like. But one can also wish for more specific substance of thought than Rosen here provides.