The Emergence of a Scientific Culture: Science and the Shaping of Modernity 1210-1685

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Stephen Gaukroger, The Emergence of a Scientific Culture: Science and the Shaping of Modernity 1210-1685, Oxford University Press, 2006, 544pp., $65.00 (hbk), ISBN 0199296448.

Reviewed by David Marshall Miller, Yale University


Western modernity is inextricably linked to Western science.  Unique amongst world cultures, Westerners evaluate progress in scientific terms, so that science becomes a model for all human disciplines and practices.  Indeed, the objectivity and certainty that science is supposed to provide are often used to justify the West's sense of superiority and the imposition of its values across the globe.  In The Emergence of a Scientific Culture, Stephen Gaukroger begins an extensive study intended to explain why this is so.  He aims to show how science has become central to Western culture down to the present day.  This is a vast scholarly undertaking, and the present five-hundred-page volume, merely the first in a projected five-volume series, is devoted to the formative period of Western science, from the beginnings of Aristotelian Scholasticism in the twelfth century to the Newtonian synthesis near the end of the seventeenth.  Though Gaukroger engages cultural questions, he is an intellectual historian primarily concerned with the philosophical and theological debates by which natural philosophy and science came to prominence.  Comparative and socio-cultural approaches are set aside in order to construct detailed accounts of the changing intellectual landscape in renaissance and early-modern Europe.  While this strategy makes the book useful for professional historians of philosophy and science, it leaves a full satisfaction of Gaukroger's broader explanatory aims for later volumes.

The Emergence of a Scientific Culture is divided into five parts, the first of which serves as an introduction to the entire "Science and the Shaping of Modernity" project.  Here, Gaukroger argues that the "gradual assimilation of all cognitive values to scientific ones" is a "distinctive feature of Western modernity" (page 11).  Wherever reasoning is identified with science, there is the modern Western world.  Yet, Gaukroger continues, traditional accounts have mistaken the rise of Western science by describing how science originally distinguished itself from other forms of human reasoning, especially religion.  Science has spontaneously developed in other cultures, but only in the West has it become self-perpetuating.  So the essential question is not how Western science came to exist in the first place, but how it then broke free from external constraints to constitute a set of values "open to no refutation from the outside" (page 19).  Gaukroger claims that this "consolidation" came about, not in opposition to religion, but in cooperation with it.  Specifically, science satisfies a natural-theological aim originally set in a religious context unique to the Judeo-Christian West.

In the subsequent sections of the book, Gaukroger reconstructs the development of natural philosophy from the medieval period to the latter half of the seventeenth century.  In the middle ages, Gaukroger contends in Part II, the contemplation of nature was subordinate to Christian theology, a synthesis first established by the Church Fathers on a basis of classical Neoplatonism and Stoicism.  The Investiture Controversy of the tenth and eleventh centuries, however, forced the Church to incorporate itself as a source of coherent explanations of the world without the authority derived from the state.  The philosophical resources of the "Augustinian Synthesis" proved insufficient to this task, and theologians were forced to call upon the natural philosophy inherent in the newly re-discovered Aristotelian tradition.  As the thirteenth-century condemnations of Aristotle show, however, his accommodation to Christianity was awkward, and Aquinas's eventual "Aristotelian Amalgam" made natural philosophy and revelation distinct but equal sources of understanding.  From this point on, natural philosophy gained recognition as "the principal point of entry into our understanding of the world" (page 4).  Even so, the study of nature in Thomistic Scholasticism remained beholden to theological concerns regarding the interpretation of Scriptural revelation.  The same was true of the Platonic (or, in Gaukroger's term, "Naturalist") and natural history traditions that arose during the Renaissance.

As Part III describes, natural philosophy began to seek its own way during the sixteenth and seventeenth centuries.  While Scholasticism devolved into mere disputation and theology foundered during the Reformation, natural philosophers redefined themselves and their project.  Inspired in part by independent advances in astronomy and mechanics, they shifted their aims away from the kind of transcendental truth sought in religion toward "objectivity and use."  Natural philosophers began to seek means of discovering new explanations and the ability to predict phenomena, rather than simply accommodating observed facts to a priori principles derived from other fields.  Meanwhile, authors like Bacon, Galileo, and Descartes constructed a new persona for themselves -- the professional natural philosopher working outside both Church and university.  Altogether, these developments established a methodological space for natural philosophy that was distinct from Christianized Aristotelianism.  One no longer had to appeal to theology in order to justify natural philosophical activity.

The fourth part of the book then details the development of this newly liberated natural philosophy in the seventeenth century.  In particular, Gaukroger discusses the work of significant authors organized into three general movements:  mechanism, experimental philosophy, and the quantification of nature.  Of course, this tripartite framework is fairly standard, and the account here will be familiar to most professional historians of science.

In the final part of the book, Gaukroger obliquely returns to the question raised in the first by describing how the new natural philosophy of the seventeenth century began to impose its methods and values on other areas of cognitive inquiry, such as politics, morality, and theological discussions of divine causation and creation.  Such issues remained intertwined, and the natural philosophy of the time took on an aspect of natural theology -- an investigation of nature still in pursuit of religious aims.  Nevertheless, natural philosophy was now in a position to constrain theology, since it did not depend on the latter for its authority.  This set the stage for the definitive break to come, Gaukroger maintains, in the latter part of the nineteenth century, when science and religion ultimately went their separate ways.  This, however, is beyond the scope of the present text.

The Emergence of a Scientific Culture identifies science both "as a particular kind of cognitive practice, and as a particular kind of cultural product."  With this dual view, Gaukroger happily steps out of the old debate in which, broadly speaking, philosophically-inclined "internalist" historians saw science as an intellectual discipline, socio-cultural "externalist" historians viewed science merely as a human practice, and both approaches severely distorted the object of their study by denigrating the importance of the other.  By examining science as an intellectual and cultural phenomenon, without regard to the distinction, Gaukroger offers a more accurate, less ideological understanding of science and its history.  Indeed, his interest in how the cognitive values of science came to possess cultural significance could have barely been stated, let alone answered, in the context of either internalism or externalism since it presumes that intellectual and cultural values are on a par.  At the very least, Gaukroger's starting observation that the intellectual enterprise of Western science gained a cultural traction unique among world cultures frames a novel and promising mode of historical enquiry.

However, Gaukroger's own enquiry, at least in this volume, does not follow his stated intentions.  The historical treatments in the later parts of the book are not obviously motivated by the programmatic considerations raised in the first part, and Gaukroger does little to demonstrate the cultural penetration of natural philosophy.  Instead, he provides a very conventional intellectual history of natural philosophy without much examination of broader cultural contexts.  For instance, Gaukroger discusses the ethical arguments made by Bacon, Galileo, and Descartes to justify their natural-philosophical personae, but he does not consider how such arguments -- or the personae themselves -- were received by the society toward which they were directed.  Hence, there is no discussion of Galileo's condemnation, Descartes' failure to have his philosophy accepted by the religious authorities in France, or the political disputes involving Cartesianism in the Netherlands.  Nor, furthermore, does Gaukroger devote any attention to the formation of scientific societies or to the reception of scientific thinking in existing institutions, such as princely courts, universities, or religious orders.  Yet it is just such episodes that show the interplay between science and culture and demonstrate how and why natural philosophy began to shape cultural values in the early modern period.  Indeed, certain passages cry out for a more contextual explanation, such as Descartes' appeal to the figure of the honnête homme (pages 215-17), the public enthusiasm for New World natural history in the 1630s (page 360), or the arguments against philosophical "dictatorship" amongst early apologists for the Royal Society (pages 353-5).  A fuller examination of these subjects would help illustrate the intersection of cultural, political, and scientific values, but Gaukroger quickly returns to his philosophical history.  This intellectual focus simply cannot support the cultural claim he wishes to make.  The book's conclusion, it should be said, gives some indication that Gaukroger will turn to cultural issues in later volumes, but his thesis is not vindicated here.

Another difficulty lies in Gaukroger's mode of presentation.  In outline, this book is about different intellectual trends and traditions that come together and spin apart over the course of time.  To exemplify these developments, though, Gaukroger uses individual authors from the philosophical pantheon, especially once he reaches the Renaissance.  For instance, the work of Telesio and Bruno alone is taken to represent "the host of naturalist writings that appeared from the mid- to late sixteenth century -- whose authors included figures such as Cardano, Paracelsus, Fracastro, Servetus, Stellato, Porzio, and Campanella" (page 106).  These latter figures then receive no further attention.  Later, Descartes speaks almost exclusively for mechanism as a whole.  The analyses of individual authors, moreover, are not substantially connected.  Gaukroger does not detail how the work of one author develops out of another's -- each stands on his own.  So, while this philosophical pageant generates a good picture of natural philosophy as embodied by particular thinkers at particular moments, it skips over the transitions between them.  This is problematic because the scientific and cognitive values Gaukroger wishes to illuminate are visible in the process of cognitive inquiry, not in its final products.  A cognitive value does not guide, say, the particulars of Descartes' corpuscularianism.  It guides Descartes' decision to adopt that view and reject others.  Because Gaukroger generally does not explain how an author comes to his position, he does not show why a theory satisfies a scientific or cognitive value better than available alternatives.  Thus, Gaukroger's narrative avoids the very context in which cognitive values, scientific or otherwise, are clearly operative.  Indeed, it is never quite clear what is meant by "scientific values" since they are never witnessed in action.  A fortiori, the rising importance of scientific values in the shaping of cognitive inquiry remains obscure.  Again, the historical exposition is inappropriate to support the thesis.

Nevertheless, Gaukroger's mode of presentation may be the redeeming feature of The Emergence of a Scientific Culture.  However one judges the overarching thesis, the book can also be evaluated as a work of intellectual history of science.  In this light, it fares better.  The extensive, detailed discussions of individual figures and episodes that obscure the general thread of argument are, on their own, quite lucid and well-referenced.  Remarkably, Gaukroger makes arcane medieval metaphysics seem straightforward and manages to condense the entire scope of Cartesian natural philosophy -- including matter theory, physics, cosmology, geology, psychology, and physiology -- into about sixty pages (pages 289-351).  In effect, Gaukroger has summarized wide swaths of the existing literature on the many topics he addresses, including his own previous work on Bacon and Descartes.  There are some important omissions:  Gaukroger makes little mention of practical mathematicians, like Tartaglia, Benedetti, and Stevin, and none at all of astrology, alchemy, or magic (though these traditions were essential factors in the formation of Western science).  Nor is this book accessible to a novice reader since so much is left in the background.  Still, the old-fashioned heavyweights are well represented.  Augustine, Abelard, Aquinas, Scotus, Ficino, Bruno, Zabarella, Bacon, Kepler, Gilbert, Galileo, Gassendi, Beeckman, Hobbes, Descartes, Malebranche, Boyle, Huygens, Hooke, Newton, and Spinoza, as well as Scholasticism, Naturalism, Aristotelianism, Neoplatonism, Averroism, Copernicanism, and Humanism all appear in digest form, backed up by a forty-page bibliography of primary and secondary sources.  There is not much novelty here, but, by the same token, Gaukroger's accounts are consistent with the standard understanding in the field.  A professional historian of science seeking a convenient point of entry into one of these topics could do worse than consulting this tome.  This text would also be especially useful to philosophers looking for the historical context of particular arguments.

Few historians have the ambition to attempt a synoptic treatment of the entire history of Western science at anything more than an introductory level.  Certainly, no one has undertaken such a project in recent years, when so much has been added to the secondary literature.  Gaukroger's book is a comprehensive, narrative overview of the state of the art.  Although Gaukroger's approach fails (so far) to support his stated thesis, the result is valuable in its own right.  The Emergence of a Scientific Culture and its companion volumes will fill an empty niche on scholars' bookshelves.