The Emergence of Modern Aesthetic Theory: Religion and Morality in Enlightenment Germany and Scotland

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Simon Grote, The Emergence of Modern Aesthetic Theory: Religion and Morality in Enlightenment Germany and Scotland, Cambridge University Press, 2017, 280pp., $99.00 (hbk), ISBN 9781107110922.

Reviewed by Corey W. Dyck, Western University, and Michael H. Walschots, University of St. Andrews


Lying behind the juxtaposition of contexts in the subtitle of Simon Grote's well-executed study -- those of Enlightenment Germany and Scotland -- is an attempt to outline an alternative history of the development of philosophical aesthetics in the 18th century. While recent histories of modern aesthetics, including those by Frederick Beiser, Stefanie Buchenau, and Paul Guyer, have emphasized the signal contributions of figures such as Baumgarten and Hutcheson to the founding of aesthetics as a self-standing philosophical discipline, Grote contends that this is a story whose coherence derives largely from its presentation as an inexorable march towards Kant, either insofar as Kant's aesthetics succeeds in addressing the various problems unconvincingly treated by his predecessors or insofar as these figures succeed only in anticipating Kantian aesthetic concepts.

By contrast, Grote sets out to reconsider this period in the history of aesthetics independently of its significance for the subsequent development of a modern (especially Kantian) aesthetics through attending to the complex of issues at stake, foremost among which are theological and moral concerns. These include contemporary debates concerning the source of obligation and the natural fitness of the human being to act morally, not to mention issues pertaining to the role of Scripture in moral education and to the proper training of clergy. Grote's claim, then, is that these debates form an essential, and widely overlooked, backdrop to and driver of the development of aesthetic theory in both Germany and Scotland in this period.

Grote outlines his case for this in the German context in the first three chapters, where he considers the context for Baumgarten's aesthetics supplied by the controversy surrounding Wolff's philosophy at the Friedrichs-Universität in Halle. The events leading to Wolff's exile from Prussia in 1723 are relatively well-known -- Wolff's Pietist colleagues in the theology faculty at Halle prevailed upon Friedrich Wilhelm I to sanction Wolff, ostensibly for his defense of the Leibnizian pre-established harmony -- though Grote seeks to re-orient the root controversy around a disagreement between Wolff and the Pietists concerning the "foundation of morality."

According to Wolff, obligation is rooted in an internal drive for perfection such that moral action consists in acting in accordance with that which is perceived to promote our own perfection and that of others. This gives rise to Wolff's view that moral improvement consists in improving our cognitive faculties so that we reliably perceive clearly and distinctly what does in fact promote our perfection and, consequently, act in accordance with this perception. However, Wolff's account, rooting morality wholly within an internal drive rather than obedience to a divine law, and apparently making knowledge of what God wills and the fear of God irrelevant to moral motivation and improvement (and in so doing making virtue attainable by the atheist), was rejected as false and dangerous by the Pietists. Grote's account of the basis of the controversy has the virtue of tracing the Pietist opposition to Wolff back to a genuine philosophical objection rather than to a rabid anti-intellectualism or merely to professional differences;[1] moreover, Grote's account has the effect of giving a number of rather marginalized figures a place at the center of the debate, including Johann Franz Buddeus, Johann Georg Walch, and Nicolaus Hieronymus Gundling.

However, it remains doubtful whether the specific issue of the foundation of morality actually constitutes, as Grote puts it, "the heart of the controversy" (p. 23). What first galvanized the Pietist opposition to Wolff was his book on metaphysics, and given that this text provided the occasion for their least charitable criticisms and misrepresentations of Wolff (as, for instance, a Spinozist, a fatalist, and an atheist), the temptation on the part of a scholar sympathetic to Pietist thought to look somewhere besides Wolff's metaphysics as a basis for their opposition is readily understandable. And yet, Wolff's views on morality cannot be neatly separated from their foundations in his metaphysics -- his identification of freedom with a form of spontaneity, his denial of the independence of the will from the intellect, his application of the principle of sufficient reason to acts of the human will, and even his intellectualist conception of the divine intellect. Re-orienting the Pietismusstreit around the debate about the nature and source of obligation thus risks drawing attention away from these other, and arguably deeper, issues.

Even so, this novel angle on the debate does succeed in foregrounding the sorts of concerns Alexander Gottlieb Baumgarten likely brought to the Wolffian philosophy, and the centrepiece of Grote's study consists in a highly insightful and original discussion of the context and ultimate significance of Baumgarten's aesthetics. Something of a consensus has emerged in the (recent) secondary literature that key innovations of Baumgarten's metaphysics reflect his appreciation of the practical deficits of Wolff's thought,[2] and Grote makes the case that Baumgarten's aesthetics is likewise animated by his conviction that poetry in particular plays an important role in moral improvement. As Grote shows, key Pietist thinkers and influences on Baumgarten, such as August Hermann Francke, made use of the term aisthesis in connection with the apprehension of the affections of a sanctified soul, particularly in the reading of Scripture. Understood as such, aisthesis involves the grasp of a spiritual truth, communicated by God, in a lively way such that the affections of readers/auditors are engaged towards the end of their moral improvement.

According to Grote, Baumgarten's interest in aesthetics and his consideration of the power of living cognition to engage and elevate the affections of the lower faculties of the mind arises from this background, rather than constituting (as might be thought) a simple extension of Wolffian rationalism into the realm of clear and confused ideas. Grote documents the theological context for Baumgarten's first publication on aesthetics, the Meditationes philosophicae de nonnullis ad poema pertinentibus of 1735, which, according to Grote, aims to supply the criteria by which we can identify divine inspiration in the affections of the authors of sacred poetry. Drawing on additions in his Metaphysica of 1739 to Wolffian epistemology, including the addition of "living cognition" to the familiar Leibnizian taxonomy, Baumgarten seeks in his Aesthetica (1750/58) to elaborate the techniques for cultivating such cognition, which involves the perfection of sensible cognition and is closely connected with moral improvement (p. 116). Through this lens, Grote proceeds to consider Baumgarten's ethical writings and outlines his distinctive intervention into the foundation of morality debate: that the lower cognitive faculties constitute a ground for desire and natural moral obligation, and that moral education and improvement can involve the cultivation of (logically) indistinct cognitions and affections.

Unquestionably, Grote's provocative reconsideration of the context and significance of Baumgarten's science of sensible cognition opens new avenues for approaching all of his aesthetic writings, and the Aesthetica in particular. However, it is less clear that this science must represent a "divergence" (p. 103) from Wolff in the direction of the development of an emphasis on the importance of "the exercise of the senses and the sense-related faculties" (p. 141) that is distinctively Pietistic. On the one hand, the claim of a divergence turns on a rather narrow conception of Wolff's rationalism as reducing to his acceptance of the "mathematical method" (p. 68) and his prioritization of the distinct cognition yielded by the intellect in cognitive and moral contexts. Yet, this would be to overlook the foundational role that the lower cognitive faculty, and the senses specifically, play in Wolff's theory of cognition. For instance, he claims that all of the thoughts of the soul originate in sensations, and it is only insofar as the soul has a faculty for sensation that its essence can be determined as a power for representing the world.[3]

On the other hand, further evidence would be required to show that the Pietist emphasis on aisthesis has to do first and foremost with a sensible form of sensation. Indeed, Grote himself characterizes this as a "spiritual sensation" or involving "spiritual affections" in contrast to "natural" sensations and affections (cf. pp. 76 and 82). Moreover, it is precisely along these lines that Joachim Lange, a key Pietist opponent of Wolff, criticizes Wolff's apparent reduction of the soul's powers to its lowest faculty as (deliberately) removing "God and spiritual things" from its ken,[4] a criticism that tells against any specifically Pietistic emphasis on the soul's lower powers. Given this, it is open to question whether Baumgarten's aesthetic philosophy constitutes a divergence from Wolff or whether it is an attempt to develop the resources available within Wolffian thought to respond to the concerns that animated his Pietist critics (concerns Baumgarten shared), albeit in a way that they would not have been amenable to.

In the final two chapters, Grote turns to a similar debate concerning the foundation of morality in the context of Scottish Enlightenment thought. He offers a nuanced account of the ways in which both Shaftesbury and Hutcheson contributed to various debates in contemporary moral philosophy. Grote illustrates, on the one hand, how Shaftesbury and Hutcheson take up common cause against their predecessors (most notably Hobbes, Locke, and Pufendorf) in contending that virtue is natural to human beings in the sense that they desire it internally and value it for its own sake, and so the human being does not stand in need of external laws and their associated rewards and punishment. On the other hand, Grote points to an overlooked difference between the two. Shaftesbury (like Baumgarten) views aesthetic pleasure on a continuum with the pleasure involved in moral action, and therefore conceives of aesthetic improvement as contributing in an important way to moral development, whereas Hutcheson, according to Grote, rejects the claim that moral virtue has anything in common with the desire for pleasure, whether it is a desire for pleasure in the beautiful or otherwise, but must be valued and desired disinterestedly.

On these points, the philosophical secondary literature might be appealed to by way of expanding on, but also challenging, Grote's reading. For example, Grote contrasts Shaftesbury's "unmistakably egoist" (p. 181) conception of moral education with Hutcheson's, which Grote describes as "the progressive strengthening of one's own natural, instinctive benevolence" (p. 178) and which, Grote suggests, is brought about not only through reflection on the nature of good and evil, but also by means of "habituation." Indeed, Hutcheson assigns an important role to habit and custom in the process of both moral improvement and degradation into moral depravity, an importance underlined, for instance, by Roberts.[5] Even so, that there is as stark a difference on this score as Grote suggests has been recently challenged by Stephen Darwall (and others), who contend that Hutcheson (at least at one point) preserves some role for self-interest in the process of moral education.[6]

In the final chapter, Grote turns to the life and philosophy of William Cleghorn, a relatively unknown figure of Scottish Enlightenment philosophy (apart from his winning the chair in moral philosophy at Glasgow over Hume), who, according to Grote, bears Shaftesbury's standard in the ongoing debate concerning the foundation of morality. Cleghorn held a rationalist theory of moral perception, an account of moral education similar to Shaftesbury's, and also adopted a position between Hutcheson and Hume on justice. He maintained, similar to Hume, that justice is an artificial virtue, but at the same time, similar to Hutcheson, maintained that justice is a species of benevolence. Grote argues convincingly that Cleghorn's position should be included in the history of aesthetics because, on Cleghorn's view, moral education involves training the imagination to appreciate the beauty of a well-formed political society (p. 232). More generally, Grote illustrates that Cleghorn is a figure who does not fit easily into standard divisions of eighteenth century British philosophy into "rationalist" and "sentimentalist" schools. Indeed, Grote explicitly challenges such categorizations, and the case study of Cleghorn should provide ample motivation to reconsider widespread oversimplifications of Scottish Enlightenment thought, and to draw attention to Cleghorn as a nuanced and original thinker in the period.

Grote offers a compelling and historically detailed account of how the history of aesthetics in eighteenth-century Germany and Scotland is much more than a prelude to the development of independent modern views. Grote argues convincingly that key debates and controversies in aesthetics in both the German and Scottish contexts grew out of and were heavily influenced by the positions various authors took on the question of the foundation of morality. What is particularly highlighted by Grote's study is that the breadth and significance of the debates on the foundation of morality in both eighteenth-century Germany and Scotland are still not well understood and, on the basis of the commonalities he exposes between these contexts, he lays the foundation for future work to further compare and distinguish them.

Yet, whether Grote succeeds in offering an alternative history of the emergence of aesthetics that does not find a sort of teleological culmination in Kant is open to question. After all, Kant allows that beauty is (but) a symbol of morality, a claim that at once gestures towards the historically important role that the cultivation of sensible cognition plays in moral improvement as it reaffirms Kant's distinction between disinterested aesthetic appreciation and properly moral action which is motivated by an interest in the good. In the end, then, it might be that what Grote offers is not so much an alternative history of the emergence of aesthetics in which Kant plays a minor part, but rather an alternative route to Kant, albeit one that better foregrounds the richness of the intellectual debates and traditions in eighteenth century Germany and Scotland.

[1] In this, Grote develops a line of interpretation sympathetic to the Pietists most influentially defended by Bruno Bianco (in “Freiheit gegen Fatalismus. Zu Joachim Langes Kritik an Wolff” in Zentren der Aufklärung I: Halle, ed. N. Hinske, Wolffenbüttler Studien zur Aufklärung 15 [Lambert Schneider, 1989], pp. 111–55).

[2] This is a core contention of Clemens Schwaiger’s Alexander Gottlieb Baumgarten. Ein Intellektuelles Porträt (Stuttgart-Bad Cannstatt: Frommann-Holzboog, 2011). See also Corey W. Dyck, “Between Wolffianism and Pietism: Baumgarten’s Rational Psychology,” in Baumgarten and Kant on Metaphysics, eds. C. Fugate and J. Hymers (Oxford University Press, 2018), pp. 78-93.

[3] See Christian Wolff, Vernünfftige Gedancken von Gott, der Welt und der Seele des Menschen, auch allen Dingen überhaupt (reprinted, with introduction and notes by Charles A. Corr, in Christian Wolff, Gesammelte Werke, Pt. 1, Deutsche Schriften, Vol. 2. Olms, 1983), §§749–53.

[4] See Joachim Lange and Christian Wolff, Des herrn Doct. und Prof. Joachim Langens Anmerckungen über Des herrn Hoff-Raths und Professor Christian Wolffens Metaphysicam, nebst beygefügter Prof. Christian Wolffens gründlicher Antwort (1724), pp. 40–6.

[5] See T.A. Roberts, The Concept of Benevolence (MacMillan, 1973); cf. especially p. 113.

[6] See S. Darwall, The British Moralists and the Internal Ought (Cambridge University Press, 1995), pg. 230-1; H. Jensen, Motivation and the Moral Sense (Martinus Nijhoff, 1971), pg. 90ff.; and M.P. Strasser, Francis Hutcheson’s Moral Theory (Longwood Academic, 1990), pg. 98. For a contrary view, see M. Gill, The British Moralists on Human Nature and the Birth of Secular Ethics (Cambridge University Press, 2006), pg. 194.