The Emergence of Sexuality: Historical Epistemology and the Formation of Concepts

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Davidson, Arnold, The Emergence of Sexuality: Historical Epistemology and the Formation of Concepts, Harvard University Press, 2002, 272pp, $42.00 (hbk), ISBN 0674004590.

Reviewed by Linda Martin Alcoff , Syracuse University


Although Michel Foucault’s philosophical writings from beginning to end focused on deeply epistemological questions about knowledge and science, his ideas remain almost entirely absent from epistemological debates in the English-speaking world. No doubt this is due to his style, not a linguistic style but what Ian Hacking calls style of reasoning, by which he means to invoke the kinds of differences that occur between aesthetic styles and relate these to differences in scientific inquiry. In short, Foucault’s work on knowledge is not easily translatable into the more familiar problematizations of epistemology. The best attempts thus far at such philosophical translations of Foucault have been in Ian Hacking’s and Gary Gutting’s work, though Hacking can be frustratingly elusive on the core topics of justification, truth and reference and Gutting’s interpretations do not reach the stage at which Foucault developed his notion of power/knowledge, one of his most well-known, interesting, and difficult concepts.

In the last several years, Arnold Davidson has been filling this gap by developing an interpretive account and application of Foucault’s work on knowledge and science (as well as of Canguilhem and Bachelard’s), and these essays, together with some new ones, are now usefully collected in The Emergence of Sexuality: Historical Epistemology and the Formation of Concepts. To be sure, this collection reaches beyond Foucault--Davidson’s own original analyses are also evident here--and his interpretation of Foucault as an epistemologist of sorts is itself original and provocative, and will no doubt raise the ire of those who would place Foucault in more of a postmodernist camp. But Davidson’s demonstration of the utility of Foucault for a host of ongoing debates in psychology, psychoanalysis, historiography as well as epistemology is persuasive and amply developed in several fascinating examples.

Historical epistemology, as Davidson develops it, is not simply doing a history of epistemology, though there is some of that, but primarily an epistemological analysis of the history of knowledges, not just with an eye toward assessing truth but more so with assessing how some things, and not others, become candidates for truth-value. Analytic epistemologists generally portray this kind of project as outside the domain of epistemology proper, unless one is offering a judgement about the epistemic viability, in today’s terms, of prior modes of knowing. If epistemology is defined as the pursuit of justification and truth, history holds no intrinsic interest. What is most valuable in this book is Davidson’s insistence that a concern with the history of concepts and with the variable ways in which statements are made candidates for truth-value should not be seen as extra-epistemic issues, or as mere sociology or ideology-critique. The pursuit of truth will be enhanced if we come to a better understanding of how the domains of knowledge emerge, are delimited, and constrained by the peculiar ways in which concepts are formed in different historical moments.

For example, Davidson shows in a fascinating chapter on sex (with pictures) that, before the last hundred and fifty years, anatomy was exhaustive of sexuality. That is, one could not fathom the idea, so commonplace today, of a person being anatomically one sex and psychologically another. The very concept of the homosexual requires this distinction, which is why we should not import current ideas of homosexuality to the past. This claim was made by Foucault, but Davidson makes an even stronger case for it through his studies of the representations of Christ’s sex (not, he argues, his sexuality, a category that did not exist), and through his detailed studies of the development of psychiatric reasoning. One way to explain the latter development, and one which could be misleadingly taken from Foucault himself, is that psychiatry appropriated for itself a domain of judgement and diagnosis previously accorded to the morality of the church. Instead, psychiatry emerged from the possibility of conceptualizing a sexual subjectivity and “mental individuality,” to quote Krafft-Ebing (63), that constituted types of persons above and beyond their physical morphology.

Whether the question of truth is related to such historical studies depends on how they illuminate the question of reference. Is the distinction between anatomy and sexuality a contemporary illusion, or a fact about human experience that was recently discovered? One of the laudable features of Davidson’s work is that he shows how we must complicate such questions, but that such complications are not ways to avoid questions about the referentiality of science’s claims. The complication is that the concepts can affect and even produce experiences, in this case, experiences of sexuality, which then have an effect on our practices, perceptions, and the perceptions that others have of us, all of which create the “feedback loop” peculiar to the human sciences that Hacking calls “dynamic nominalism.” The referentiality of medical or psychiatric terms is thus historically delimited; hence the importance of history.

Foucault was no idealist, nor did he effectively reduce the production of scientific concepts and categories to the operations of social interest. For this reason, Davidson says, against Hacking on this point, “I find the label ’social construction’ utterly inappropriate …”(xiii). This is apparently because Davidson fears that the idea of social construction conveys the relativist definition of truth as ideology, and leads people to believe that the work of historical epistemologists such as his own and Foucault’s requires rejecting the traditional attempt to uncover what was really happening in the past, or rejecting any objectivist account of how the best practices of science validate their claims. It would be interesting to hear what he has to say about Hacking’s recently published The Social Construction of What?, which artfully unpacks the variable possible meanings of the idea of social construction and demonstrates that they do not all entail wholesale repudiations of realism in any form. Davidson does not explain or pursue the debates over social construction, other than to align it with a view that would eschew epistemology altogether.

Like Rorty, Putnam and other contemporary pragmatists, Davidson dismisses the “absolutist/relativist distinction” outright, but not for the reasons they give. Pragmatists generally point to the unintelligibility of the distinction, and repudiate any need to address charges of relativism since this would require a philosophical elaboration of truth and reference that is entirely unnecessary and results from a kind of category mistake. Davidson’s approach here should be much more persuasive, or at least more interesting, to those who find the pragmatist ridicule for concerns with ontology as overly glib.

In several essays, but especially in the essay that addresses the idea of evidence as developed by Carlo Ginzburg, Davidson argues that the more relevant distinction than absolutism/relativism is that between conditions of validity and conditions of possibility. Conditions of validity involve those bread-and-butter issues about which epistemologists and methodologists of the social sciences are most familiar, issues involving evidence, proof, the criteria of justification, and truth. Conditions of possibility, by contrast, are concerned with a different level of the knowledge-generating process, the level at which statements become formalizable as candidates for truth. Thus, it is not that those who are concerned with the conditions of possibility, such as Foucault, are discrediting the concern with conditions of validity, as the charge of relativism would imply, but that they are focused on a different arena.

Davidson’s approach also works to discredit the sharp distinction between sociological and epistemological approaches to knowledge, despite the fact that he mainly distances himself from the former. Foucault distinguished between three kinds of approaches to the study of knowledge: intradiscursive, which is the domain of epistemology as traditionally understood, interdiscursive, which is the domain of the archeological method Foucault himself developed, and extradiscursive, which is the domain of genealogy or the relations of knowledge and power, and thus what might be traditionally understood as the domain of the sociology of knowledge. But here Davidson introduces Wittgenstein’s linguistic and pragmatist based ontology as a way to rethink the relations between these distinct approaches, to bring them closer than Foucault himself was able to articulate. Foucault’s idea that discourses construct the objects of which they speak is essentially parallel, if not identical, to Wittgenstein’s argument that ontology is supervenient on a grammar. Thus, it is not that all questions of ontology or of reference are unintelligible, but that they operate within contingent historical constructs which should be understood not as words standing alone as much as practices of which words are a part. With more than a touch of irritation, Davidson complains that “One might have thought that Anglo-American philosophers would have learned from Wittgenstein that concepts cannot be divorced from the practices of their employment” (181).

This is all that Foucault means when he speaks of “the games of truth,” Davidson is suggesting, and not the radical idealism or epistemological nihilism of which he is so often accused. But this also means, again contra Rorty, that there are in fact quite a few critical questions yet to be explored in regard to reference, and neither the intradiscursive nor the extradiscursive approaches will be sufficient to explain any given ontology. A concept like “perversion,” for example, cannot be assessed in terms of its ability to capture some aspect of the world without making use of each of these approaches, and, further, exploring the relations between the extra-, intra-, and inter-discursive domains in their concurrent use of such a concept. Most importantly, Davidson makes a strong case that the traditional approaches to questions of knowledge still in use today, and which share with positivism the idea that justification can be assessed in an acontextual manner, work to deter attempts to explain or explore the production of those experiences and forms of subjectivity to which so much of the social sciences seek to refer. He insists that such explorations must still be guided by the normative requirements of evidence and the aim toward truth, and thus what he argues we need overall, it seems to me, is not a replacement of epistemology but a more complex and detailed account of proof, evidence, and truth.

Davidson’s work thus raises our ability to conceptualize new ways to do epistemology and to understand the benefits of the new historical and social studies of science for those of us with more of an epistemological interest than a strictly historical one. He does not bring all of these questions to closure, however. It remains unclear exactly how his relativizing of concepts to their context avoids the anti-realism that he claims to avoid. One also wonders whether the sharp distinctions he draws between the understanding of concepts in different periods, e.g. “sex”, should be understood as incommensurable, to bring up Kuhn’s old nightmare. Why he ignores the excellent work in historical epistemology by Mary and Jim Tiles is another question. Finally, I found myself resisting the easy libertarian assumptions he seems to be making without much reflection and that justify his admonishment to reject all moral or pathological approaches to the formation of problematics around sex and sexuality. The call for a complete “laissez aller” is just as much implicated in current discourses of perversion (and dare I say, ideology) as is the medicalizing of pleasure, and thus just as much in need of an extradiscursive, and not merely intra-or interdiscursive, analysis.