The Emergence of Spacetime in String Theory

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Tiziana Vistarini, The Emergence of Spacetime in String Theory, Routledge, 2019, 142pp., $155.00 (hbk), ISBN 9781848935938.

Reviewed by John Dougherty, Ludwig-Maximilians-Universität München


Physicists and philosophers are both invested in the nature of space, time, and spacetime, and they often look over each other's shoulders for insight and guidance. For philosophers, spacetime is intertwined with issues of persistence, determinism, and more. For physicists, spacetime is inseparable from gravity, especially in the light of Einstein's general theory of relativity. In both communities it is often said that one of the great lessons of Einstein's theory is the principle of "background independence", which advises against attributing any fixed, necessary features to spacetime. This principle is often invoked to reject quantum theories of gravity on which facts about spacetime are insufficiently contingent. In particular, this complaint is usually levelled at string theory.

In her book, Tiziana Vistarini defends string theory from the charge of background dependence, arguing that the theory "shows background independence in different ways and degrees" (ix). Her defense consists of five vignettes, each presenting some feature of string theory as evidence that the theory makes no illicit assumptions about spacetime's necessary features. Taken together, these cases are meant to show something stronger: string theory doesn't just take the structure of spacetime to be contingent, it repudiates a spacetime background entirely. According to string theory, Vistarini argues, space and time are not "built into the fundamental structure of the physical world", but are "derived, emergent structures" (12).

The execution of this argument is likely to be most interesting to philosophers of physics that have at least a nodding acquaintance with string theory. Vistarini takes a physics-first approach, beginning each case study with a description of the relevant physics and then drawing lessons about background independence and emergence from this description. These lessons are not deeply systematized: they do not result in an explicit account of background independence or emergence, nor are they used to critique extant accounts of these notions. So you will find no simple take-home message about background independence or emergence in general. But this is part of Vistarini's point: string theory exhibits a "quite composite notion of spacetime emergence", and attention to the details of the theory is required for "producing a metaphysics sensitive to the physics occurring at the Planck scale" (ix).

The book opens with two chapters of philosophical and physical stage-setting. The first delineates the senses of emergence at issue. For most of Vistarini's discussion, the relevant notion of emergence is ontological (not epistemic) and is an instance of metaphysical explanation, or grounding (not supervenience). To show that spacetime could emerge in this sense is then to show that it admits of explanation by something more fundamental in string theory. The other opening chapter, "Strings in a nutshell", sketches the basics of bosonic string theory, the paradigmatic toy string theory. The presentation of theory is standard, and the background is necessary, but I expect that a reader not already familiar with the theory will need to refer to a textbook to follow all the details. In later chapters, most readers will require some external references.

The remaining five chapters are the five case studies. They are essentially independent and self-contained, so I'll take the liberty of discussing the ones I find most interesting first.

Chapter 3 is the most developed case study. The case is the derivation of the Einstein field equation, the central equation of general relativity, from string theory. If we consider a test string in the right context -- not vibrating too much, not stretched too tightly, not interacting with other strings too strongly -- then we can show that it must act as if living in a familiar relativistic block universe. In particular, it must act as though it lives in a spacetime obeying the Einstein field equation. Vistarini argues that this is a kind of background independence: if we assume that there are contexts in which the string behaves like a classical string moving in spacetime, then we needn't make any further assumptions about the structure of that spacetime. In particular, we needn't assume that the spacetime behaves as we'd expect from Einstein's theory; this is ensured by the behavior of the other strings that our test string is interacting with.

Vistarini's analysis of this case is a good representative of the book's philosophical arguments. Her account of the physics extracts many philosophically relevant issues, like the appearance of particles that carry gravitational force in the spectrum of the string's vibration and the role of symmetry in the derivation of the Einstein field equation. And her arguments connecting these to background independence are convincing. However, these arguments would have been easier to evaluate were they set against particular accusations of background dependence in string theory. The general picture on offer is relatively clear: a primordial soup of vibrating strings will give rise to particles that carry gravitational force, and a well-behaved string immersed in this soup will have the experience of moving in a relativistic block universe. But this isn't responsive to every accusation of background dependence that string theory faces. For many accusers, any talk of a particle carrying gravitational forces violates background independence, since particulate descriptions of gravity typically presuppose a fixed spacetime background. Because Vistarini isn't responding to specific challenges it's not always obvious what needs to be shown to establish a claim of background independence. Nevertheless, the features of the case that she addresses will surely figure in any defense of string theory's background independence and are themselves of philosophical interest for reasons she describes.

Chapter 6 contains Vistarini's most provocative -- and, for me, exciting -- proposal. In this case, the feature of string theory at issue is its moduli space, a mathematical space that "represents the totality of possibilities for stringy worlds" (102). Roughly, a point in moduli space represents one of the classical limits of the quantum theory. For example, Schrödinger's famous thought experiment concerning a cat in a box involves a moduli space with two points: one representing a classical world in which the cat is alive and one in which it's dead. Vistarini suggests that we take a theory's moduli space to be modal space according to that theory. That is, a point in moduli space is a world at which some proposition can be true or false, closeness in moduli space is similarity of worlds, and so forth. Using this reading, Vistarini offers a positive argument for string theory's background independence: the moduli space gives us the set of possible worlds, so independence from some structure is secured if that structure isn't the same at every point of moduli space.

The positive account of background independence in terms of moduli spaces sketched in this chapter is intriguing, and I think Vistarini is on to something. However, the sketch needs some filling in. This is a project on her agenda; for example, she indicates forthcoming work in which she appeals to this proposal to develop a modified Lewisian semantics for counterfactuals. But Chapter 6 consists primarily of an exposition of moduli spaces and deformation theory, with a suggestion at the end "that some 'law-like' deformations of laws might be more fundamental than laws" (100). The upshot of this exposition isn't as sharp as that of Chapter 3. There, specific results like the particle spectrum of the bosonic string and the conformal anomaly are isolated and their philosophical consequences indicated. Here in Chapter 6 there aren't such easily identifiable technical results, and the main philosophical concept of "deformations of laws" is left unarticulated. Deformation theory and moduli spaces are suggestive, but more will have to be said to work out this suggestion's consequences.

Chapters 4 and 5 both concern dualities in string theory. Quantum theories are often obtained from classical theories via a quantization recipe, and this recipe is part of how we interpret the target system of the quantum theory. So we obtain a quantum model of two particles by quantizing a classical Newtonian theory of two particles, we obtain a quantum model of the electromagnetic field by quantizing a classical model of that field, and so forth. It often happens that a quantization recipe can turn two quite different classical theories into quantum theories that are equivalent in some sense; the two classical theories are then said to be "duals". The interpretation of dualities has been a dominant theme in the recent philosophical literature on string theory, and Chapters 4 and 5 extend Vistarini's previous work on the subject.

Vistarini argues that dual theories have the same content and parlays this into an argument for background independence. Chapter 4 deals with a duality involving winding and vibration: the quantum theory of a quickly vibrating small loop of string is equivalent to the quantum theory of a slowly vibrating piece of string wound into many large loops. Vistarini argues that this is equivalence of the strongest sort: the two quantum theories describe identical systems, because they are empirically indistinguishable in principle. It follows that at least one of the classical pictures must be wrong about spatial facts -- in particular, about the size of the string loops. Chapter 5 pushes this argument further in the context of holographic dualities, where the dual theories disagree about the number of dimensions of space. If there is a fundamental fact about the world's dimensionality then one of these theories must get it wrong, and the dimensionality it reports must be emergent and non-fundamental. "But dual physical theories cannot be competitors since they share the exact same physical content" (98). So they must both be wrong, and the apparent four-dimensionality of spacetime must emerge from some third, deeper, non-spatiotemporal regime.

Like Chapter 3, Chapters 4 and 5 isolate interesting features of string theory and the philosophical puzzles they pose. These chapters also motivate features that Vistarini's view shares with other views in the literature: the strong reading of "equivalence" in the characterization of duality, the conflict between the asymmetry of emergence and the symmetry of duality, and more. But, as in Chapter 6, the upshot isn't obvious. As Vistarini puts it, duality "shows a criterion of non-fundamentality, rather than identifying directly and exhaustively what is fundamental in string theory's physical ontology" (93). Though Chapters 4 and 5 explain how duality gives rise to this criterion, it does not defend this criterion from some of its well-known challenges. Why should we think that the "equivalence" of dual theories is more than "formal analogy"? What justifies confidence in a third regime from which the two dual theories arise? To some extent these questions turn on expectations about future developments in physics, so it would be unfair to demand conclusive answers here. But they also have philosophical dimensions that have been raised in the literature and are not addressed here.

The final case study in Chapter 7 indicates one way that geometric features of spacetime might emerge from a fundamentally non-geometric regime. In quantum mechanics, position and momentum are complementary: they can't be attributed simultaneous precise values. Many quantum theories of gravity suggest that in some contexts space and time are also complementary in this way. Backward causation looms: if two events can't be attributed precise positions in time then we may not be able to attribute temporal precedence to the cause. But it turns out that string theory avoids this fate. String theory does predict space-time complementarity in some contexts, but in these contexts strings conspire to prevent any occurrences of backward causation, and at classical scales the familiar structure of spacetime is regained. Vistarini takes this to be an instance of geometric structure emerging from non-geometric structure and an illustration of how spacetime might emerge from non-spatiotemporal structure more generally.

As in Chapter 6, the discussion of the string-theoretic results in Chapter 7 is more developed than the discussion of their philosophical upshot. As Vistarini notes, the arguments that string theory exhibits space-time complementarity without backward causation assume that the space-time complementary itself emerges from a lower level that lacks it. So in its current form this argument doesn't really illustrate the emergence of spatiotemporal structure from non-spatiotemporal structure. Vistarini is aware of this, and in response she appeals to other results suggesting that space-time complementarity appears at the fundamental level in string theory. But the significance of these results isn't obvious: if there's space-time complementarity at the fundamental level then it seems there must be space and time, so this is just more emergence of spacetime from spacetime. Perhaps it's sufficient for background independence that fundamentally spacetime exhibit complementarity, but without a more substantial account of background independence on the table it's hard to say.

This book presents a snapshot of an interesting research program in progress. The case studies isolate philosophically relevant features of string theory, and I found them informative and thought-provoking. I would recommend it to any philosopher of physics with an interest in current philosophical debates about quantum theories of gravity. Readers looking for explicit philosophical conclusions are likely to be most interested in chapters 3 through 5, and those seeking food for philosophical thought in string theory should look to chapters 6 and 7. There's work to be done in extracting and sharpening conclusions from these case studies and in defending these conclusions from arguments that string theory falls afoul of well-motivated constraints on theory development, and this book is a good start on that work.