The Emotional Mind: A Control Theory of Affective States

The Emotional Mind A Control Theory Of Affective States Book Cover

Tom Cochrane, The Emotional Mind: A Control Theory of Affective States, Cambridge University Press, 2018, 244pp., $99.99 (hbk), ISBN 9781108429672.

Reviewed by Colin Klein, The Australian National University


Tom Cochrane's book forges into the philosophy of emotion on a new and powerful vehicle: the idea of valent representations. His project is ambitious. Cochrane uses valent representations to give models of affect, pleasure and pain, emotion, moods, expressive behavior, social intentionality, norms, collective effervescence, inner speech, sentiments, personality, and character. Philosophers interested in any of these topics will find it a rich book, full of nuance and insight.

Chapter 1 introduces the idea of valent representations. They are not necessarily the only primitive kind of mental content, says Cochrane, but they have a kind of content, and form the primitive foundation for other affective states. Valent representation is built around the idea of negative feedback loops. Detection of something in the world gives rise to an intermediate state that gives rise to a response. If there's inhibition between the action and the world state, then the loop will drive the organism to avoid that state. If the inhibition comes between the world and the detector (and the detector is otherwise intrinsically active) then the organism will seek out the world state.

So, for example, a heat detector on the front of an organism that drives reverse action will move the organism away from a heat source, thereby lowering the activity of the detector. The result of this simple structure looks very much like an aversion to heat. Swap things around, so that the organism moves forward until heat inhibits the detector that drives movement, and you get a thermophile.

These two types of structure, Cochrane argues, give rise to behaviors that look a lot like aversion and desire (23). They are inspired by Millikan's pushmi-pullyu representations, in that they are both about the world and drive appropriate action. What makes them about the world -- and so distinguishes the view from enactivism -- is the presence of the intermediate detector state. This intermediate state can drive action in the absence of its typical cause, which in turn makes it count as a representation (29). The intermediate state also allows for more complex combinations of associated detectors, for primitive priority orderings between states, and thereby allows more complex combinations of activity in response to the world.

I am sympathetic to the idea that these homeostatic loops play part of the story for building up representational capacity. I pause to note two problems with using them as a foundation. These are worth marking off not just because they are problems for Cochrane, but because they present problems for any simple theory of affective representation that starts with homeostatic control. First, Cochrane carves off some obvious counterexamples by restricting valent representations to those which are embedded in a system of similar representations working together for self-maintenance. (Cochrane frames this as the requirement that the system be alive, but he admits of the possibility of artificial systems with some kind of "artificial analogue of being alive" (24); the broad criterion he gives for being alive thus seems more useful). That rules out things like negative feedback loops in the climate as representing greenhouse gasses. Even given that, there are plenty of homeostatic mechanisms that would meet the criteria but that feel odd to call fully representational. Low blood pressure will activate stretch receptors in the heart, which stimulates the release of aldosterone, which increases sodium reabsorption in the kidney, which raises blood pressure. Similar non-neural, non-mental homeostatic mechanisms abound. Aldosterone might be a good indicator of blood pressure, might reliably covary with blood pressure, might do all the things that have been counted as sub-representational in the philosophical literature. On Cochrane's view it would seem to have representational status, but that feels like a stretch -- or at least in want of more argument.

Second, Cochrane places a fair bit of weight on the approach/avoid dichotomy (he argues, for example, that this structure can "explain the symmetrical nature of our ordinary concepts of pain and pleasure", 46). Yet there are simple control systems that do not produce simple approach or avoidance. Hunger drives C Elegans to start a random search of its environment. Being random, this is as likely to take it further from any particular bit of food as it is to bring it closer; random search is effective, but not directional. Nor must simple control states have simple effects. Varieties of Braitenberg's (1986) 'Vehicle 4' have a nonmonotonic response link between detector and effector, and so can, for example, orbit a light source at an appropriate distance. All of these seem to involve mechanisms no more complex than the ones Cochrane considers. Do we proliferate valence? Do we carve off, apparently arbitrarily, the simple approach/avoid ones as especially important? I am not sure. I am broadly sympathetic to the use of control representations, though; sorting out these questions seems like it would provide interesting strands for future research.

Chapter 2 builds upon simple approach-avoid valent representations to offer a theory of pleasures and pains. Cochrane situates his theory in the contemporary landscape, arguing that while valent representation bears similarities to contemporary imperativist and evaluativist theories, the complexity of valent relationships allows for a more nuanced story. Cochrane offers a view of pleasure as success: the experience of pleasure is a higher-order state that represents the action of an attractant valent state successfully managing its concern (57); pain is, mutis mutandis, a higher-order state that represents the failure of concerned action (61).

We arrive at emotions in Chapter 3. The stated goal is to specify necessary and sufficient conditions for being an emotion, and therefore defend emotion as a natural kind. The core idea is that all emotions possess a formal object, which is the status of the organism relative to a broader context of concerns (74). Different emotions are distinguished by the respective contexts (which can in turn be temporal, modal, or social), and emotions are distinguished from bodily sensations because the latter are concerned only with one's immediate bodily situation.

Bodily feelings and their contested relationship to emotions form the core concern of Chapter 4. Cochrane attempts to walk a narrow path. Emotions always involve bodily responses (indeed, bodily responses "play a necessary role in fixing the content of the representational state", 118). Yet his theory is not strictly Jamesian, he claims, because emotions don't necessarily involve an experience of those bodily responses (91). Indeed, Cochrane says, emotions don't have to be conscious at all (113). Emotions typically include bodily feelings, however, and these give emotions a dual kind of intentionality. Bodily feelings themselves are feelings of "the affordances offered by our own body in relation to the external environment" (102); this formulation in turn allows for the individuation of emotional bodily feelings from moods and from non-emotional bodily feelings.

Subsequent chapters put the theory of affect to work. Chapter 5 discusses the expressive aspects of emotion through bodily reactions, and the role that these play in collectively regulating social life and maintaining social norms. Chapter 6 develops a theory of conscious thought, focusing on the paradigm of inner speech and its role in emotion generation and regulation. That in turn sets up the story in Chapter 7, where habits of emotional regulation are employed to give stories about personality and character. Roughly speaking, 'personality' refers to individual differences in sensitivity of emotional regulation systems and responses (159), while 'character' is a more active level of affective control that regulates responses over a lifetime. Character is fleshed out in terms of sentiments: that is, of long-term commitments to specific things you care about (159). Maintenance of sentiments is done in part by our ability to construct narratives about our own lives (175ff).

Cochrane's strategy throughout the book is to layer control systems on top of control systems, allowing for increasingly complex and abstract varieties of control. Chapter 8 concludes the book by talking about person-level agency. Mental agency, Cochrane says, depends on memory of past situations as well as the ability to select representational content in ways that serve appropriate ends (183). The overall picture strikes me as broadly Dennettian: there are multiple competing control functions, and "person-level agency is best identified with whichever control function happens to have attentional priority at a given moment" (185).

The book ends with an appendix that presents Cochrane's proposed taxonomy of emotional states along seven different dimensions. The nominal target is the circumplex theory of emotions. I admit that this left me cold. His proposed dimensional structure is to be preferred, I take it, because it captures more variation. Yet the mere presence of additional complexity does not address the concerns of the factor-analytic tradition that motivates lower-dimensional models. The guiding motivation of that tradition is to reduce the apparent complexity of emotional life to something manageable. Russell and Feldman-Barrett's (1999) review of dimensional theories already recognizes the need for additional structure (whether in core affect or in our conceptualization of particular episodes) and is sensitive to the interpretive challenges that are raised by factor rotation. (Cochrane's discussion of the Big 5 personality traits in 7.3 suffers from a similar problem.)

This was one of a few places where I thought that the book sat uneasily between empirical engagement and traditional philosophical reflection. The discussion in Chapter 4 of whether emotions are a natural kind, for example, would seem to invite the sort of reflection on what natural kinds are and how well (or poorly) emotions hang together. Cochrane's argument, however, appears to rely on the assertion that we can identify a formal object for all given emotions, and that this gives the class the required unity. That is an argument, and may even be a good one, but it is playing a different game than many recent philosophers have been playing.

Such concerns, however, are part of what makes philosophy of emotion such complex territory. As I've indicated, Cochrane's wide-ranging book makes valuable contributions to a wide variety of topics. I also found the book particularly interesting as an instance of a representationalist control theory. For a long time, philosophy of mind was (broadly speaking) split between representation-heavy classical computationalists and the antirepresentationalists who took their cues from the cybernetic tradition. Though Cochrane does not position himself this way, it strikes me that his work belongs to a burgeoning line of work that is inspired by control theory but is still unashamedly representationalist -- and so, for example, belongs in the same broad neighborhood as internalist versions of predictive processing (Hohwy 2013) or work on value inspired by reinforcement learning (Haas 2020). Cochrane's intricate, sensitive discussions of particular emotional phenomena combined with his broad survey of the contemporary literature make it valuable for anyone with an interest in the affective mind.


Braitenburg, V. (1986) Vehicles: Experiments in Synthetic Psychology. Cambridge: MIT Press.

Haas, J. (2020) Moral Gridworlds: A Theoretical Proposal for Modeling Artificial Moral Cognition. Minds & Machines 30, 219-246.

Hohwy, J. (2013) The Predictive Mind. New York: Oxford University Press.

Ruseell, J.A. and Barrrett, L.F. (1999) Core affect, prototypical emotional episodes, and other things called Emotion: Dissecting the elephant. Journal of Personality and Social Psychology 76(5): 805-819.