The Empire of Habit: John Locke, Discipline, and the Origins of Liberalism

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John Baltes, The Empire of Habit: John Locke, Discipline, and the Origins of Liberalism, University of Rochester Press, 2016, 157pp., $80.00 (hbk), ISBN 9781580465618.

Reviewed by Douglas Casson, St Olaf College


The title of this work is taken from Locke's discussion of association in the Conduct of the Understanding. Locke praises those with "a vigour of mind able to contest the empire of habit, and look into its own principles." By resisting the power of habitual associations, such individuals exhibit a freedom "which few men have the notion of in themselves, and fewer are allowed the practice of by others." (CU §41). Intellectual freedom, for Locke, involves contesting the empire of habit.

Yet, as John Baltes observes, Locke not only celebrates resistance to habit's power, he also deploys that power for his own purposes. In his writings on epistemology, education, and governance, Locke appeals to techniques of habituation in order to shape subjects who are disciplined in both thought and action. The central question of this study, then, is whether Locke's commerce with the empire of habit cheapens his commitment to freedom. For Baltes, it would seem that the answer is yes.

Viewing Locke within an explicitly Foucauldian frame (my copy of the book has an image of Bentham's panopticon on the cover), Baltes challenges "Locke's commitment to liberty or freedom," at least insofar as this commitment is defined by autonomy (90). He argues that the scholarly focus on Locke as a contract theorist has obscured the primary implication of his political thought, that his disciplinary practices serve to naturalize his moral obligations. For Baltes, the Lockean (and by extension, the liberal) individual is "deeply disciplined and thoroughly normalized, and as a result, governed more by habitual virtues than by rational reflection or autonomous calculation" (43).

For a short book, this volume covers quite a bit of ground. Baltes surveys Locke's philosophical, educational, and political works with special attention to the way in which these works place the Lockean subject within structures of power. He rejects the idea that Locke's thought is animated by a commitment to the truth of natural law or to the self-determination of the individual. The political declarations of the Second Treatise, he argues, must be read in light of the philosophical concessions of the Essay Concerning Human Understanding. By conceding that human nature is almost infinitely malleable, Locke opens the door for medical, penal, and religious techniques of social control. In fact, throughout his writings Locke employs techniques of quarantine, surveillance, and correction to forge docile, industrious, and pious subjects capable of inhabiting a new, nominally liberal, empire of habit.

Baltes offers a provocative challenge to readers of Locke. By pointing out the ways in which Locke appeals to the disciplinary power of custom and habit, he shows that Lockean liberty cannot be reduced to simple non-interference. Freedom for Locke cannot mean doing whatever we wish with ourselves and our possessions. Of course, Locke would be the first to distance himself from this type of unbridled freedom. He insists in the Second Treatise on the distinction between liberty and license. Baltes suggests, however, that Locke has no standing for making this distinction beyond the normalizing power of discipline. For Baltes, habits of self-regulation and self-governance are a threat to freedom, not its necessary precondition. Not every reader will be convinced.

In the first chapter, Baltes presents Locke's Essay as a work of radical deconstruction. He argues that Locke is not simply supplying grounds for assent or making space for a new science; he is disarming dangerous dogmatists. Locke attacks innatism primarily for political purposes, and replaces appeals to nature or revelation with a thoroughgoing conventionalism. On Baltes's reading of Locke, we do not arrive at moral truths by attuning ourselves to "the language of nature . . . We impose meaning through an effort of will, in the service of our goals and purposes" (27). Locke's conception of morality, insofar as it rests on mixed modes, is "a mind-dependent construct" (28). We can be certain of a mixed mode only insofar as we have created it.

While this conventionalist view of morality might explain a diversity of moral claims, it also reveals "a dangerously chaotic moral universe in which core concepts vary over time and space" (31). Having unsettled the moral order, Locke reestablishes it through discipline. He posits the malleable subject and places it in the context of what James Tully has called a three-part "juridical apparatus," governing over divine, political, and customary realms.[1] The structures of law and punishment work together to project "a moral universe fashioned by the will of a benevolent, providential God" (38). In practice, however, the rewards and punishments of divine law and civil law are eclipsed by the rewards and punishments of the law of fashion. In the end, Baltes argues, Locke's epistemological engagements leave him with no other moral or political standard except that which can be generated by discipline, habit, and custom.

In the second chapter, Baltes turns to Locke's educational writings as a case study in normalizing and disciplining conduct. He starts with Locke's comparison, at the beginning of Some Thoughts Concerning Understanding, between a child's mind and the headwaters of a river (STCE §1). The educator's task is to channel the emerging thoughts by carefully directing impressions and experiences. What in other contexts Locke describes as obstacles to rational assent -- power, habit, custom -- become tools for the educator to shape young minds. Baltes is especially interested in Locke's recommendation that a parent monitor the company children keep in order to protect them from "the contagion of rudeness and vice." Instead of exposing them to "roughness and ill-breeding" abroad, Locke recommends that children be taught through private instruction (STCE §70). Baltes describes this approach as an "inverted quarantine." By isolating young gentlemen from the infectious habits and dangerous tendencies of less disciplined children, Lockean educators are able to shape their wards' behavior and desires. Baltes labels this careful supervision and calculated management "panopticism." Within the framework of this system, moral rectitude is not the result of rational judgment but habitual relish. Those who have acquired the right kind of mental relishes through repetition and inculcation are those who are able to obey appropriate norms, to internalize external commands. This internalization in turn enables the disciplined subject to live within permissive institutions. Baltes writes, "Panopticism makes possible a system of government arguably preferable to its alternatives" (61). He ends the chapter with the striking claim that even subjects capable of revolution come into being within the confines of disciplinary structures imposed by the educator. Locke's revolutionaries are docile revolutionaries.

In the third chapter, Baltes focuses on the economic context of Locke's proposals for the impoverished and the unemployed. He offers a glimpse at the unsettling conditions that prompted Locke to propose reforms. The precipitous decline in wages as well as common grazing rights combined with the rapid increase in birth rates, inflation, and enclosure led to widespread misery and a growing class of vagrants. Baltes argues that Locke's approach to this situation is analogous to his approach to education; he advocates a variety of disciplinary technologies to contain and remedy what he sees not only as a practical problem but also a moral contagion. In this section of the book, Baltes presents a variety of primary and secondary references to proposals that involved surveillance, sorting, containment, and regimented labor. Some of these sources, such as Edward VI's Vagabond Act of 1547 or an anonymous tract on workhouses in Sheffield from 1789, are significantly removed from Locke's historical context.

Yet Baltes uses these and other texts to identify two approaches to the poor that he also identifies in Locke. He links the first approach to the Protestant Reformation, in which the practices of monastic obedience and discipline were diffused into society at large. By insisting that ordinary Christians attend to their own salvation, the Reformation placed "the concept of God at the center of a panoptic complex of correction and social control" (77). As ordinary labor takes on new significance, individuals internalize habits of devotion and self-discipline as a way to glorify God. The second approach to the poor is linked to medical responses to plague. Here Baltes surveys the way in which delinquency is connected to disease, and remedies are presented within the language of public health. He finds in Locke's proposals "a series of techniques lifted wholecloth from the experience of the Black Death and the Reformation" (84). The discipline and habituation imposed on the pauper is strikingly similar to that imposed on the young gentleman. Through containment, surveillance, and correction, both the poor and the rich are taught thrift, morality, industry, and self-restraint.

In the final chapter, Baltes presents Locke as fundamentally elitist and inegalitarian. He argues that Locke views women, laborers, and rural poor as fundamentally incapable of participating in the polity on equal footing. Baltes's argument here hinges on Locke's service to the Earl of Shaftesbury. In that role, he argues, Locke's primary political goal was to advance the standing of a small group of aristocrats. Baltes rejects Ashcraft's account of Locke as a revolutionary in practice and Waldron's account of Locke as a democrat in theory.[2] Instead he establishes Shaftesbury's elitism by distinguishing his policies from the Levellers and then presents Locke's Second Treatise as "an expression of his mentor's principles" (95). In the economic context of enclosure, Baltes argues, Locke's defense of property rights is really an argument for aristocratic privilege. By equating revolutionary politics with Leveller policies, he is able to show how Locke, "ever Shaftesbury's man," departs from these radicals. In response to Waldron's claim that Locke rejects a natural intellectual hierarchy, Baltes insists that Locke's religious writings undermine any commitment to the idea of a "democratic intellect." Although Locke might write that "the candle, that is set up in us, shines brightly enough for all our purposes" (ECHU 1.1.5), Baltes argues that passion and lust extinguish that candle (109).

Baltes's reading of Locke as a radical skeptic leads him to the conclusion that ultimately there is no place in Locke's account for reasonable judgment. He transforms The Reasonableness of Christianity into a call for obedience to divine command. Insofar as such an appeal imposes an external standard, Baltes argues, Locke's admonition that individuals should align themselves with God's purposes is inegalitarian and repressive. In a startling declaration that is left unexplained, Baltes announces: "Gay marriage, physician-assisted suicide, nonprocreative sex, atheism: all these would fall victim to the commands of Locke's teleological God" (111). Just as Baltes implies earlier in the book that habituation is incompatible with freedom, he declares here that the idea of a purposeful God is incompatible with human agency. Without acknowledging the long tradition of theological and philosophical debates over this topic or even Locke's own struggle to come to terms with divine sovereignty and human liberty, Baltes reduces Locke's engagement with Christianity to what he calls an "unsatisfying argument-ender: 'Because God says so'" (112).

John Baltes provides a valuable service to readers, introducing them to an especially thorny problem in Locke's philosophical and political thought. The puzzle at the center of this book, that resisting the tyranny of habitual thinking involves forming habits of resistance, is worth investigating. The Foucauldian lens that Baltes employs helps to reveal the social forces and disciplinary techniques that sustain Lockean self-government. It shows how Locke's malleable subject is first formed by norms and practices before it is capable of entering into a social contract and making the types of probable judgments that sustain civil government.

Yet Baltes's Foucauldian lens also obscures important issues and limits crucial considerations. First, Foucault's vocabulary permeates this study to such an extent that at times the distinction between Locke's words and Foucault's words seems to dissolve. This is exacerbated by the author's habit of integrating quotations into his account without indicating who is speaking. Foucault's description of Bentham's panopticon or the Mettray Penal Colony is offered as an illustration of Locke's approach to education or poverty without any explicit differentiation between the sources. Careful readers will find themselves flipping back and forth to the endnotes to be certain of the source.

Yet an even more unfortunate way in which the Foucauldian lens obscures instead of illuminates here is that it seems to restrict exploration of the crucial issue at stake. Baltes unmasks Locke's appeal to habit and custom. Yet the crucial issue seems to be whether forming habits of self-regulation and self-government threaten individual liberty. This issue is left underexplored. Occasionally Baltes hints at the possibility of a more complicated relationship between discipline and liberty. At one point he even writes that "deeply normalized subjects are capable of liberty" because they are "liberated from the need for a politics of constantly coercive violence, and willingly complicit in their habitual conduct" (44). If Locke is not promoting liberty as non-interference or self-creation, what sort of liberty is he promoting? Locke has much more to say than is included here. The Empire of Habit would have been more compelling had Baltes engaged Locke directly on the question of whether the self-governed and self-disciplined subject can experience liberty worth the name.

[1] James Tully, "Governing Conduct: Locke on the Reform of Thought and Behavior" in Approach to Political Philosophy: Locke in Contexts (Cambridge University Press, 1993)

[2] John Ashcraft, Revolutionary Politics and Locke's Two Treatises of Government (Princeton University Press 1986), Jeremy Waldron, God, Locke, and Equality: Christian Foundations in Locke's Political Thought (Cambridge University Press, 2002).