The Empirical Stance

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Van Fraassen, Bas C., The Empirical Stance, Yale University Press, 2002, 304pp, $30.00 (hbk), ISBN 0-300-08874-4.

Reviewed by Richard Rorty, Stanford University


The Dwight Harrington Terry Foundation Lectures on Religion in the Light of Science and Philosophy have been given at Yale Divinity School for almost a hundred years. The lecturers have included Dewey, Jung, Maritain, Tillich, Rebecca West and, most recently, Bas van Fraassen. This ambitious, absorbing, iconoclastic, metaphilosophical treatise, which incorporates van Fraassen’s Terry Lectures, demonstrates the wisdom of Yale’s choice.

Van Fraassen begins with criticisms of analytic ontology, especially Australian materialism (the Place-Smart-Armstrong-Jackson tradition). Since “’world”’ is not a count-noun but a “context dependent term that indicates the domain of discourse of the sentence in which it occurs”’ (24) we should not, in our philosophical capacity, form beliefs about what the world contains. As philosophers, we can have stances, but not beliefs. Scientists, and other “objectifying inquirers” who restrict themselves to observing and theorizing about entities in particular domains, are entitled to beliefs. But philosophy should not try to model itself on science.

Metaphysical claims like “matter is all there is” are usually fleshed out by defining “matter” as whatever scientists are currently talking about. But it is pointless to do so, for “the spirit of materialism is never exhausted in piece-meal empirical claims” (55). It is, rather, expressive of “strong deference to science in matters of opinion about what there is” (59). Materialism and empiricism are both stances, but the former attends to the content, and the latter to the procedures, of science. The latter is preferable, for the former seduces one into metaphysics. “If empiricism is a stance, its critique of metaphysics will be based at least in part on something other than factual theses: attitudes, commitments, values, goals.” (48)

After criticizing the analytic philosophers’ versions of metaphysics, van Fraassen turns to criticism of currently fashionable attempts to naturalize what he calls “objectifying” epistemologies by hooking them up with cognitive science. Like metaphysics, this kind of epistemology tries to see around all future corners by delimiting the possibilities open to future inquiry. For both “imply that I will be in error if I come to believe something not captured by its description of what I am” (79). But all the objectifying epistemologist can do is attempt to eternalize some presently available discourse—to do, e.g., for contemporary neuropsychology what materialist metaphysicians do for contemporary particle physics. So the next conceptual revolution may well leave her stranded. Neither she nor the metaphysician can leave room for such revolutions except by emptying their theses of content. They cannot escape a dilemma: either parochialism or triviality.

Van Fraassen takes conceptual revolutions to present the central problem faced by the kind of epistemology he favors—”voluntarist”, non-objectifying, epistemology. (He sees William James as having advocated this sort of epistemology, especially in “The Will to Believe”.) The problem is that we would like to say that it was rational for the pre-revolutionaries to have become post-revolutionaries, even though doing so meant adopting a view they found absurd. So we need to find something that “can play the role of changing the basic parameters of our problem situation, the very parameters upon which decision-theoretic reasoning depends” (102). This something is, as Sartre suggested, emotion. The voluntarist epistemologist must figure out “how to view the role of emotion in…the epistemic enterprise as a whole” (108).

Van Fraassen, however, does not explicitly pursue this task. Instead, he turns from Sartre to Feyerabend. He enlarges upon the latter’s analogy between the Jesuit critique of the Protestant slogan Sola Scriptura and standard criticisms of foundationalist empiricism’s implicit slogan: Sola Experientia. The Jesuits were right in saying that Scripture without tradition is indefinitely flexible, and therefore cannot serve as a criterion for choice among alternative traditions. T. H. Green, Sellars, and Feyerabend were right to insist that experience without a descriptive vocabulary is blind, and thus incapable of providing a criterion for choice among alternative conceptual repertoires. Presumably van Fraassen would say that the emotions which were indispensable to effecting conversion from Catholicism to Protestantism were of the same sort as those that facilitated the switch from Aristotelian to Galilean descriptions of motion.

That emotions play an indispensable role in conceptual revolutions does not mean, however, that such revolutions should be viewed as irrational. For we can solve the problem of “royal succession” in science by noting that “natural language is inexhaustibly rich in the possible ways of being made more precise” (114). Emotion may be required to get us over the hump—to make the absurd seem plausible. But the post-revolutionaries need not think the pre-revolutionaries to have been absurd. They can instead think of them as having been imprecise. Just as the language of the Catholic tradition was rich in possibilities exploited by Luther and Calvin, so the language of Aristotle provided resources developed by Galileo.

Van Fraassen neatly sums up the moral of this part of the book when he says that “the rule of Sola Scriptura or Sola Experientia is at war with itself. In one role it maintains orthodoxy and forbids heeding the alternative interpretations ingenious minds can concoct. But in its other role it devalues any aspect of orthodoxy that can be identified as interpretive. This entails a permission that can successively peel off layer after layer, possibly leaving nothing intact at the end” (142). Formulations of enduring criteria, either for right interpretation or for correct theory-choice, will always be either parochial or empty.

The closing portion of the book is titled “What is Science—and What is it to be Secular?” Here van Fraassen turns to the traditional tasks of a Terry Lecturer, and asks, as a preliminary to discussions of Fackenheim, Buber and Bultmann, “Does the empirical stance allow for anything other than a secular orientation?” (153) It does, he says, because, though science is a (but not the only) paradigm example of “objectifying inquiry” (154), such inquiry is not enough: “Science, whether understood with the scientific realist or with the empiricist, provides us with a world picture. Accepted in either sense, it can be our entire world picture. But if it is, we ourselves don’t seem to fit into our own world picture” (189). Materialist metaphysicians think that it certainly should be our entire world picture, but the empiricist stance merely allows that it might be. To decide whether it should or not, the empiricist must ponder, in a less dogmatic way than do the materialists, “the question of how to think about persons, especially because that topic covers the, for religion, all-important subject of personal encounter with the divine” (190).

Van Fraassen defines “objectifying inquiry” in terms of five criteria: delimitation of a domain, independence of results from the work of any particular inquirer, agreement on what is relevant, observation of the relevant entities under the relevant descriptions in both natural and experimental situations, and constructing theoretical models. This definition lets him extend the reference of the term beyond the natural sciences to the social sciences and the humanities, stopping only at the boundaries of art, poetry, and the literature of “spiritual journeys of discovery”. These last three he classifies as non-objectifying forms of inquiry. In those areas there are individual adepts, but no expert cultures. Anthropologists and literary critics objectify, just as do physicists. But composers, novelists, and religious writers like John Bunyan do not.

Since “objectifying inquiry is centrally important to the characterization of science but not definitive of it”, van Fraassen suggests that the relation between science and secularism is not, as the materialist metaphysicians tend to think, logical entailment. Rather, the objectifying attitude—the view that objectifying inquiry is the only way to achieve real understanding of anything—is “central and crucial to, though not definitive of, the secular” (174-175). “It is possible to be secular and not have that attitude”. The book ends by urging that we not adopt this attitude, and that we “change the way we do philosophy” in order to make it part of an “authentic, engaged project in the world” (195). Philosophers should be conscious of the limitations of their projects in a way that metaphysicians and objectifying epistemologists typically are not.

The earlier chapters of this book, in which Van Fraassen engages with currently fashionable movements within analytic philosophy, are more persuasive than the final ones, in which he discusses the relation between science and the rest of culture. To pull the book together, he would have to have included at least a sketch of what philosophy might become after it frees itself from the temptations that motivated such movements. He needs to provide more detail than is offered in the brief section titled “What could philosophy be, then?” (61-63) about how philosophers will conduct themselves once they have put metaphysics and objectifying epistemology behind them. His explanations of terms like “voluntarist epistemology” and “non-objectifying inquiry” are too cryptic to convey an adequate sense of what he has in mind.

One problem with the book as a whole is that the meaning of the term “empirical stance” is never pinned down very firmly. We are not told much more about this stance than that assuming it produces respect for the procedures of science. It would help to be told what other stances are available. Are there any, except those assumed by religious people whose faith has not yet been de-mythologized in the manner of Bultmann? The term “stance” itself could use explication. Is there a difference that makes a difference between assuming a stance and acquiring a set of beliefs, except perhaps for what Peirce called “a certain contrite fallibilism”? If a student emerges from Philosophy 101 convinced that there is no point in trying to describe either the world or knowledge in the wholesale ways characteristic of metaphysics and epistemology, does her acquisition of that negative belief count as taking the empirical stance?

Another set of problems emerges when one reflects on van Fraassen’s treatment of secularism. Secularism is usually associated with the change from hope for post-mortem happiness to hope for a better human future here below, and thus with a shift of attention from religion and science to politics—a shift from trying to understand the world to trying to change it. It is hard to see the connection between this shift and the view that objectifying inquiry—the sort of inquiry conducted by expert cultures that deploy and test theoretical models—is our only means of gaining understanding. A lot of people have made that shift without adopting any such view, and indeed without ever having pondered any epistemological question.

Van Fraassen says that he is making use of “pragmatist and existentialist ideas”. Indeed he is, but pragmatism and existentialism agree in treating understanding as a means to more important ends. Both distance themselves from positivism by their relative lack of interest in science. For pragmatists like Dewey, science was one among many other tools to be used to change the conditions of human life. For Heidegger, it was merely the enabler of technology. Sartre pretty much ignored science altogether. There is a certain tension between van Fraassen’s own focus on science (and neglect of politics) on the one hand, and his anti-positivistic metaphilosophical outlook on the other.

Dewey belonged to a philosophical tradition that goes back to Hegel—a tradition that regards the French Revolution as more worthy of philosophical attention than the Scientific Revolution. This tradition treats previous centuries’ concern with the relation between natural science and religion, and the Descartes-to-Kant sequence of attempts to specify the scope and limits of human knowledge, as episodes that philosophy can now put behind itself. Analytic philosophy, in contrast, was Kantian rather than Hegelian in inspiration, and inherited positivism’s conviction that science is the paradigm of rationality. Van Fraassen tries to break with positivism by insisting that science is just one among several such paradigms (p. 173). Nevertheless, he treats questions concerning the relation between science and the rest of culture as central to philosophy—even to philosophy in the service of an “authentic, engaged, project in the world”.

Readers of this book are likely to hope that it will soon be supplemented by one in which van Fraassen tells us more about what sort of projects he has in mind, and about their relevance to the academic discipline of philosophy. He grants that philosophy is “for the most part an academic enterprise, that is, also objectifying” (p. 177), but he does not discuss how that enterprise might be of use to non-objectifying inquirers. He describes his book as “a personal response to philosophy as I found it” (p. xvii), saying that he is an analytic philosopher who views the analytic revolution in philosophy as “subverted by reactionary forces”. But he has not yet made clear what analytic philosophy might look like once those forces have been overcome.