The Enchantment of Modern Life: Attachments, Crossings, and Ethics

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Bennett, Jane, The Enchantment of Modern Life: Attachments, Crossings, and Ethics, Princeton University Press, 2001, 224 pp, $17.95 (pbk), 0-691-08813-6.

Reviewed by Stanley Bates, Middlebury College


A reviewer’s first obligation should be to convey some sense of what the general line of argument of a book is, and then to respond both to that overall line of thought and to at least some of its specific parts. Jane Bennett’s The Enchantment of Modern Life poses difficult problems for both of those tasks. The specific parts of the book are so various, so interesting (and, sometimes, so contestable) that one wishes to respond to all of them. At the same time, that sheer variety makes it exceedingly difficult to discern a line of thought, or a thesis, that unifies the entire work. If there is a unifying idea, it would have to be that expressed in the title—enchantment, so this concept deserves our initial attention.

Perhaps the best way to begin to describe Bennett’s use of “enchantment” is to note that she is really writing a story of anti-disenchantment. She takes the dominant interpretation of modernity, at least in social science, to be a narrative of disenchantment (with Max Weber’s theorizing providing a convenient paradigm which she discusses in detail.) Thus, the general secularizing of belief and culture which has taken place over the past several hundred years is characterized for her by two images, “The first is the image of modernity as disenchanted, that is to say, as a place of dearth and alienation (when compared to a golden age of community and cosmological coherency) or a place of reason, freedom, and control (when compared to a dark and confused premodernity).”(p. 3) Her idea is that the characterization of the world as disenchanted may “discourage affective attachment to the world” and be destructive to the possibility of ethical life. Hence, her counter-story is to call attention to the way the world is (or “can be experienced as”--we’ll return to this distinction) enchanted, and to suggest that experiencing such “enchantment” might make one more open to the appreciation and concern for others (including non-human others) that would make possible the affective incorporation of morality in human life. Her technique in the book is not exactly to argue for this general position, but rather to recount stories of disenchantment and then to counter them with descriptions of “sites” of enchantment.

Her initial description of enchantment overlaps some of the traditional description of aesthetic experience. Here are a few of her many descriptive phrases: “To be enchanted is to be struck and shaken by the extraordinary that lives amid the familiar…,” “enchantment entails a state of wonder…,” “fear… plays a role in enchantment,” “enchantment involves a surprising encounter…” Enchantment contains both pleasure and a feeling of the uncanny. One doesn’t need to demand necessary and sufficient conditions for the application of the concept of enchantment, but the concept is pretty protean as Bennett employs it. At the most abstract level, it seems to encompass all of the ways in which human beings can enjoyably experience their presentness to the world—but if this is enchantment, who has ever denied its existence?

The disenchantment of the world tales had a particular content. What was gone (for intellectuals) was religion—both traditional folk religion and Christianity. The “meaning of life” had been understood within the framework of religious belief. Bennett calls this a “teleological model of enchantment.” She seems to agree with the promoters of the disenchantment thesis that such a teleological model is no longer viable. What she seeks to develop is a non-teleological understanding of enchantment (something she later calls “an enchanted materialism.”) The vocabulary may be a bit unfamiliar, but surely the project isn’t. This is more or less the project of Romanticism—it might be titled by the phrase of Carlyle’s that M.L Abrams used for his great study of Romanticism: Natural Supernaturalism. It is, more or less, the project of Nietzsche: the revaluation of all values in the face of the death of God. However, she is much less ambitious than these precursors. She presents her insights as part of what she calls a weak ontology (adapting the phrase from Stephen White.) One who presents such a weak ontology “emphasizes the necessarily speculative and contestable character of [the]… onto-story, and thus does not try to demonstrate its truth in any strong sense.” (p. 161) Presumably then, any contesting of her “ontological assumptions” has already been disarmed by her own acknowledgment that they are contestable. If her claims for enchantment do not rest on argument, perhaps they should be understood as invitations to reflect on elements of one’s own experience in relation to the stories she recounts.

The various chapters of this book after the introduction are then related to each other not as parts of a developing argument but as a series of essays on various facets of enchantment as Bennett understands it. Chapter 2, “Cross-Species Encounters”, presents a number of stories, some fictional, some professedly non-fictional, of species-boundary crossings. Chapter 3 contrasts the “teleological” enchantment story of Paracelsus, to the still “marvelous”, but non-teleological, worlds in the theories (or stories) of Kant and Deleuze. Chapter 4 presents, and responds to, a series of “disenchantment tales” by Max Weber, Hans Blumenberg, and Simon Critchley. (Bennett’s talent for graceful summary and paraphrase makes this an especially informative and useful chapter.) Chapter 5, “Complexity and Enchantment”, discusses some aspects of Thoreau’s thought about nature, and Bruno Latour’s analysis of that thought. (Bennett has written a book on Thoreau and her deep acquaintance with his work, and thoughtful reflection on it, are enlightening.) Chapter 6 is an attempt to find a possible source of enchantment in some commercial advertisements. In order to do this, she feels required to respond to theoretical critiques of commodity fetishism in Marx, and in Horkheimer and Adorno. This is required because she is sympathetic to various political and environmental critiques of modern capitalism, but she still wants to account for the way that she finds enchantment in a Gap television commercial. Chapter 7 involves a discussion of the relationship of enchantment (as a kind of aesthetic dimension) to moral theory. This involves an interesting discussion of the relationship of Kant to Schiller, and, more generally, of the role of moral sentiment in moral theory. However, her own account of the role of this aesthetic dimension is that it has a much weaker role than Schiller held. The concluding Chapter 8 presents her account of her work as the presentation of a weak ontology.

This summary of the book’s contents omits many of her discussions of other thinkers and of “sites” of enchantment, but it is perhaps sufficient to give an idea of how variegated the parts of this book are. I can only respond briefly to a few of the many points that she makes. I should perhaps begin by saying that I am sympathetic to many of the anti-disenchantment sentiments. However, at many places in the book, the question arises: who has denied what Bennett wants to assert? If her crucial claim is that human beings can have aesthetic experience, love life, say yes to existence, live in the moment etc., then it’s not clear from the beginning why ordinary materialists would have to deny that claim. She seems to think that her “enchanted materialism” is necessary to rescue us from the nihilistic implications of the development of the modern scientific worldview, but most of those who accept such a view are not nihilists. Maybe they already accept the reality of a lot of what she calls “enchantment”. The question is: what is Bennett claiming when she asserts the reality of enchantment. One interpretation of enchantment would be that it is grounded in a subjective human response to the world; it is a possible aspect of human experience of the world. (This would be subjective in the sense that enchantment would necessarily be grounded in the experiencing subject. This is roughly what Hutcheson claimed about “beauty” in the 18th century.) An alternative would be to claim that the world is enchanted—that enchantment is a characteristic in the world independent of the human experience of it. The major problem I find in the text is that Bennett often says thing that sound like the latter interpretation, but nothing she presents supports anything but the former. Of course, the former interpretation is entirely adequate to support her (weak) claims for the relationship of enchantment to the ethical life. Let me pursue this with some examples.

In her Chapter “Crossings and Enchantments,” Bennett presents a list of “metamorphing creatures” to which she responds with wonder (presumably a form of enchantment.) She then discusses some of the members of the list in detail. Here is the list, “the criminal fiend Catwoman …the oceanic woman in Luce Irigaray’s Marine Lover… the strategic insects in the 1996 documentary Microcosmos …the porcine star of George Miller’s 1995 film Babe …Andoar, the goat-kite in Michel Tournier’s Friday …Deleuze’s and Guattari’s body-without-organs …Deep Blue, the machine-self who beat former chess champion Kaparov …Rotpeter, Kafka’s ape-man …Alex, an African Grey parrot learning to use abstract concepts …the technonatural creatures called fractals …Dolly, the cloned sheep.” Notice the disparities of this list of 11 items. There are real things on the list: Deep Blue, Alex, fractals and Dolly. (The insects in Microcosmos are certainly real but the context of the narrative structure of the film complicates this example.) All the others are fictional or fantasy creatures. They are certainly examples of the fecundity of human imagination. They might be enchanting to an audience. It might be revelatory of the human psyche to develop a theoretical account of why certain genres of fantasy have been capable of “enchanting” people. However, there is no ’enchanted materialism’ to be drawn from them. Of the real things on the list, the only one discussed in detail by Bennett is the case of the parrot Alex who is “learning” to use abstract concepts. She shows no caution in accepting this example despite the long history of human misattribution of reason and logic to higher animals. However, let us accept that the parrot can do what is claimed for it. Wouldn’t this then be just another fact about the world? The enchantment of the example (if one found it enchanting) would then be a human, subjective response to this fact. Why would the fantasy of crossing species boundaries be, in itself, enchanting? (Once, hiking in the high desert in California, I encountered a very still coyote at a distance of about 15 feet, and we stared at each other for almost a minute. The enchantment of that encounter for me seemed determined by the sheer specificity of that other being, which was crossing no species boundary). Bennett’s discussions of the fictional cases all treat them as though they were real—as though they really demonstrated the mobility of identity. She then seems to think that she has given examples of realities that would count against disenchantment tales. No doubt she is perfectly aware of the fictional status of these cases, but why discuss them as though they were real?

Let me give another example of Bennett’s discussion of a topic about which the status of her claims is unclear to me. She discusses, in several places in the book, her interpretation of Epicurean atomism. An early comment is “I find in pagan atomism the resources for a view of matter as wondrous, for a materialism that is enchanting without being teleological or purposive.” (p. 73) She then characterizes the physics of Epicurus and Lucretius as holding that the world consists “of tiny but active, alert, and highly mobile particles called ’primordia’“ which “are not animate with divine spirit, and yet they are quite animated—this matter is not dead at all.” (pp.80-81) There is first the question of textual interpretation. Do Epicurus and Lucretius really hold that the fundamental particles are “alert” and “animate”? (Lucretius writes “whatever is seen to be sentient is nevertheless composed of atoms that are insentient …the animate is born, as I maintain, of the insentient.” On the Nature of the Universe. (Penguin) p. 85. Hence, he seems to maintain that complex entities have emergent properties.) However, suppose we accept Bennett’s interpretation of ancient atomism. In what sense does it provide a “resource” for anything unless we believe that it is true? Of course, I think a highly plausible argument could be made that the view of matter embodied in contemporary sub-atomic physics is certainly not that it is dead or inert. Quarks don’t seem at all like “matter” as say the actual Lucretius or Hobbes or Gassendi characterized matter. Perhaps Bennett means to subsume all the features of matter as understood in contemporary physics as a version of the “swerve” in ancient atomism, but she doesn’t make that argument.

A related issue is raised by her discussion of agency in her presentation of her “enchanted materialism.” Bennett writes, “I first broaden the sense of what agency means to cover the ability to make a difference in the world without knowing exactly what you are doing, and I project this agency as distributed, to varying degrees, to atoms that move, plants that engage their environment, and animals that communicate, as well as humans …” (p. 163) Once again, the issue is what is being claimed. Does Bennett believe that atoms are “agents” in the same sense the human beings are “agents”? That just seems to be false. (Do we believe that “there is something that it is like” to be an atom?) Or, is the claim that we can project agency onto atoms (that is fantasize that they are living agents)? The latter is certainly true, and interesting, and no doubt an enchanting fiction could be based on such a fantasy. Why can’t one find enchantment in the actual world as we find it in perception and as it is presented in our best hypotheses about it in science? Science doesn’t have to be reductionist (though no doubt even some good scientists are.) It is as though Bennett thinks that science must be reductionist (i.e. roughly to conform to the view of science of Logical Positivism.) and that therefore she must attribute life/action/enchantment to the ground level, in order for it to be theoretically available at higher levels of complexity. There are real distinctions to be drawn between the inorganic and the organic, between plants and animals, between humans and other animals, even though all of these are bound up together in a single interactive reality with each other. Moreover, such distinctions don’t need to be incompatible with the core of what Bennett calls enchantment.

There is much more to say about this book, and no space to say it. The book is provocative in a good sense, and most readers will find both interesting discussions of topics and materials, and information on many topics unfamiliar to them because of the breadth of Bennett’s reading. Her discussion of the relation of enchantment to ethics is enlightening, and raises an important set of issues, which are often ignored in contemporary ethical theory.