The End of Art: Readings in a Rumor after Hegel

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Eva Geulen, The End of Art: Readings in a Rumor after Hegel, James McFarland (trans.), Stanford University Press, 2006, 206pp., $19.95 (pbk), ISBN 0804744246.

Reviewed by Tom Huhn, School of Visual Arts, New York City


Eva Geulen's slim book argues that Hegel's idea of the end of art fails -- in its beginning as well as in its end -- to qualify as a genuine idea and is better regarded as a rumor.  Further, as a rumor this notion is best encountered as it has been repeatedly enacted, that is, according to the manner in which it appears within discourse, here specifically the discourse of modern aesthetic theory.  Her premise is that the rumor stands to the concept as aesthetic reflection does to philosophy.  Geulen's book thus provocatively traces Hegel's purported idea of the end of art through the four key figures of modern German aesthetics: Nietzsche, Benjamin, Adorno, and Heidegger.  And though here all talk of the end of art might fairly be described as just talk, this rumoring spreads not only to other thinkers (gossips?) but so, too, to the problem of modernity itself:

the question of the end of art must necessarily involve the question of the end of the particular aesthetics that has left us with the end of art.  That is the aesthetics of Hegel, whose famous end of art repealed modernity before it had ever begun, thus simultaneously ensuring that the end of art would have to be repeatedly invoked.  (5) 

The end of art is thus a rumoring that continues both to provoke and to forestall our ever fully entering or departing the condition we call modernity.

One of Geulen's many insights in this crisply written book is to remark that the recent anti-aesthetic inclination of figures like Paul de Man and Jacques Derrida, as well as the rediscovery of the sublime by Jean-François Lyotard (and we might add: with its attendant gesture toward post-modernity), can be understood as the attempt, finally, to move past just that condition which, however much it permeated us, we could never fully inhabit.  Geulen thereby provides the means by which the full ambiguity of Hegel's most oft-quoted formulation in his aesthetics, and the one that provides the basis for his supposed, so-called, "thesis of the end of art" can fully resonate: "in all these respects art, considered in its highest vocation, is and remains for us a thing of the past" (cited in Geulen, 10).

Hegel, according to Geulen, does not initiate the thesis, or even the idea, of the end of art but rather inaugurates the central motif and tradition of modernity, which is to say, the discourse of modernity, by setting into motion the rumor of the end of art: 

The end of art -- this is the book's claim -- has not just been played out variously and repetitively, but the playing out occasionally provides glimpses of the rules of the game, the discursive conditions under which it is played.  At the end of the end of art one does not find an end, but a beginning: the discovery of the end of art as a discourse of modernity (14).

After a first chapter that very effectively spells out the limits as well as how much is at stake in what Geulen characterizes as the central motif of the aesthetic tradition -- explaining, for example, Derrida's absence here, despite his many writings on topics in aesthetics, since they more properly belong in philosophy than in aesthetics -- she turns in the second chapter, appropriately titled "Hegel Without End," to speak directly of Hegel's aesthetics.

Geulen's chapter on Hegel is at once among the most lucid and insightful of the many treatments in English of his aesthetics, as well as a thorough incorporation of some of the best recent writing on Hegel's aesthetics by the likes of de Man, Jean-Luc Nancy, Werner Hamacher, and Boris Groys.  It is brimful of clear and pungent formulations such as the following:

In every reflection on artistic beauty, in every philosophy of art, art is already passé.  If art is taken to be beautiful -- and for Hegel this is the case only where beauty has been philosophically recognized -- this beauty is part of the past.  Art can only be beautiful to the extent that it is known, is reborn as knowledge, and therefore has passed into the past (22).

Two specific achievements of Geulen's treatment of Hegel's aesthetics, both of which are central to the aspirations of her book, concern the significance of the symbol for Hegel, and the relation of his understanding of the function of the symbol to the way in which the very idea of classical art, and by extension the invention and role of the museum, make possible the conundrum we now find ourselves in: the tradition of modernity.  Geulen shows how Hegel construes the symbol as "protoart" due to its capacity to signify things not inherent to it.  And yet this capacity of the symbol to successfully indicate something else is at the same time grounded in the presupposition that something like a "quasi-natural meaning" nonetheless inheres in it.  Hegel's recognition of this seeming duality of the symbol leads him to refer to its intrinsic ambiguity.  Geulen in turn extends the ambiguousness of the symbol to an ambivalence between the acts of inventing and of discovering; inventing corresponds to the reach of the symbol beyond itself, while discovering is the finding of whatever meaning it is within the symbol that allows it to point away from itself.   And from here it is but a short step to an understanding of the function of classical art in Hegel's aesthetics.

Classical art, in Geulen's reading of Hegel, is the most robust instance of the attempt to at once both acknowledge as well as reconcile the two sides of the symbol's ambiguity, that is, the reconciliation -- in one era, style, or form of art -- of invention and discovery, of the "ambivalence between internal significance and external signifying function" (37).  Classical art achieves this precisely as an art of the past.  More specifically, the emphatic achievement of classical art is the transformation of the symbol into convention and tradition.  In short, tradition -- the locus of conventionality -- itself might be characterized as just that successful melding of invention and discovery:

Conventions can be denounced, suppressed, transformed, and degraded; one can accuse or praise them.  But there is only one place where conventions are produced.  The imaginary home of anachronicity, in which tradition and convention are invented in order to be rejected, transformed, or sublated, is the museum. (38) 

The museum then, obvious enough to many writers in aesthetics, functions as the entombment of the past.  Less obvious to most is that by functioning this way the museum also necessarily makes available the (modern) possibility of the establishment of traditions, and of what might be called the invention of discovery.

The continuing and continuous birth and rebirth of the tradition of modernity -- specifically as tragedy -- ought to come immediately to mind.  And therewith Geulen's subsequent chapter is titled "Nietzsche's Retrograde Motion," in which, and without explicit acknowledgement, it is nonetheless apparent that it is all too easy to replace the Hegelian tropes of invention and discovery with the Nietzschean figures of Apollo and Dionysus.  But the reconciliation achieved for (and by?) Hegel in the simultaneous invention of the museum and discovery of classical art is for Nietzsche instead tragedy, indeed a tragedy made genuine by its success at making all aesthetic appearance homogeneous:

In tragedy appearance becomes visible as appearance, and just as the privileged status of tragedy is the result of a translation, so translation is also its innermost principle: 'Dionysus speaks the language of Apollo; and Apollo, finally the language of Dionysus: and so the highest goal of tragedy and of all art is attained' (57-58). 

When all aesthetic appearances become interchangeable, tragedy comes to an end, and what Nietzsche calls "tragic knowledge" no longer has any import beyond any other form of knowledge.  Nietzsche's repeated reports of the death, demise, suicide, etc. of tragedy is characterized by Geulen as the overdetermination of tragedy's end.  And the purpose of this overdetermination is for Nietzsche to provide himself an ironic distance from the death of tragedy as well as from tragedy per se.  Irony thereby becomes the (aesthetic) means by which Nietzsche attempts to avoid the deathliness of the Hegelian end of art aesthetic.  Nietzsche's accomplishment, however, remains ambiguous (and therefore not distinct enough from Hegel's); for his ironizing of tragedy and tragic knowledge also can be read as reenactment of just that ambiguous interplay between discovery and invention.  Irony is at once the inventive undermining of a tradition -- insofar as it calls into question the legitimacy of any assertion -- as well as the reinforcement, hence discovery, of the force of some tradition.

Walter Benjamin enters Geulen's account as the subject of Chapter Four wherein he figures as the "counterplay" to Nietzsche's attempt, via irony, to forestall the endlessly repetitive gesture that founds the modern tradition of art.  Allegory and mechanical reproducibility, the objects respectively of Benjamin's study, The Origin of the German Mourning Play, and his essay, "The Work of Art in the Age of Mechanical Reproduction," become the devices, one archaic and the other modern, which Geulen construes as the unified effort to avoid the irony -- and one might also say, the dialectic -- of Nietzsche and Hegel's accounts of modernism.   The "rumor" of the end of art, in the work of Benjamin, now comes to speak not of, and hence as, the gestures of beginnings, endings, classicism, tragedy, or pastness, but rather of the very ambivalence of tradition itself, regardless of  whether it is the tradition of art.  Benjamin's rumoring thus expands to consider the fraught character of history as well as the possibility that it could, with the appropriate device, cease to be altogether, or rather: come to be in a wholly unique manner.  (No doubt Nietzsche's own "untimely meditation" on the uses and disadvantages of history might nonetheless have provided an inspiring model.)

Film -- or better, the moving camera which produces it -- serves as the premier apparatus which, according to Benjamin, has no history precisely because it is instead the capacity to produce its objects in the very act and form of their presentation.  The historical continuity previously reaffirmed by the very sequence of event followed by representation, is no longer the sole form of historical coming into existence.  History, now genuinely produced exclusively by the mechanism of the movie camera, thus collapses as but the mere representation of some prior continuity.   (The treatment of allegory in the German Mourning Play could then be read as an analysis of the problem of representation central to the character of history, as a first attempt at showing the extreme case of one thing speaking for another, and thus of what could be called history's heterogeneity to itself.)  Geulen perceptively shows how Benjamin's mechanical reproducibility essay promises a kind of future beyond the end of art, perhaps also thereby beyond the end of history.  And yet, as Geulen persuasively argues, there remains something of the ambivalence of the rumor in Benjamin's own unresolved thoughts on the nature of the famous "aura."   Though this trope has become central to the reception of Benjamin, Geulen makes innovative use of it by likening aura -- which she describes as "less a concept than a performative intervention" (84) -- to the movement of rumor: "Its [aura's] decay does not invade aura from without; rather, the decay produces it in the first place… . The explication of the aura does not proceed from a preordained standpoint, but unfolds in a series of steps and from various perspectives" (85).  In the end, however, aura is not rumor enough; it remains entrenched, even and especially in its disappearing, decaying appearance, too closely allied with the Hegelian requirement that all reflection on aesthetics begins (and thereby ends?) with the end of art.

Geulen arrives at Chapter Five, titled "Afterthought: Adorno," by way of rumor.  Just as rumors beget other rumors, though often enough the content of the latter has nothing to do with that of the former, so too is Adorno enjoined despite his being "outside the tradition of authors discussed here, for he has little to contribute to a genealogy of modernity as developed by Hegel, Nietzsche, or Benjamin" (91).  Geulen's provocative, intriguing reading of Adorno instead begins with the premise that his concern is best understood as centered on the (negative) character of language rather than on art or aesthetics.  Indeed, "Adorno advances the aesthetic as a category of experience as an alternative to the aesthetic as art" (92-93).   It will turn out that for Geulen this substitution by Adorno of experience for art is directed toward a critique of the failure of language, whose curse it is to forget as well as to suppress the difference between the world and the world of thought.  Geulen's readings from a broad selection of Adorno's writings on aesthetics are convincing, even if she finds no room for any mention of his works on music, which might well lend still more support to her claims regarding the negativity of language.  One troubling aspect of her chapter on Adorno is that its foundation relies on the exaggerated claim that the exaggerations by Adorno and Horkheimer in the Dialectic of Enlightenment amount to parody (even though there is considerable consensus regarding the observation that it is indeed rife with exaggeration): "Not parody as concept but parody in practice operates in Adorno's prose" (108).  Even without fully appreciating the difference between parody as concept versus parody as practice, one might nonetheless find it difficult to acquiesce to Geulen's premise of the parodic character of Dialectic of Enlightenment precisely because its exaggerations might instead be in service to its attempt to awaken a benumbed consciousness to the persistence of human suffering.  But then, recalling Adorno's deep sympathy with the work of Beckett, perhaps after all there is some intimate kinship between suffering and parody.  And parody, following Beckett, might well signal the imminent collapse of language.  Geulen reads this near total collapse of language in the "aesthetics" of Adorno as a kind of withdrawal into the distance of allegory, and hence no real advance beyond a similar weakness of Benjamin's aesthetics.

Geulen concludes her book with a chapter on Heidegger's aesthetics that in turn leads to a brief epilogue on the poetry of Hölderlin: "Because Heidegger's reflections on art cannot be severed from his political decision in favor of national socialism, they also represent the fatal apex of that [aesthetic] tradition, and render it transparent" (112).  This transparency is immediately made opaque, however, by the difficulties of his texts, and then compounded by the many "Heideggereze"-infected interpretations of them.  Still, Geulen succeeds in bringing much light to "The Origin of the Work of Art" essay and in recuperating Heidegger as a central figure in the rediscovery of the Hegelian end of art discourse, which is to say the return to the insight regarding the constitutive ambivalence of the modern tradition of aesthetic reflection: "What Hegel founded was, strictly speaking [no more rumoring here!], not a thing but an empty place, an indeterminacy, an unclarity, an absence.  It has proven endlessly productive" (132).  Geulen's book succeeds in bringing new significance, renewed continuity, and robust meaning to a large portion of this endlessly productive tradition.