The End of Phenomenology: Metaphysics and the New Realism

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Tom Sparrow, The End of Phenomenology: Metaphysics and the New Realism, Edinburgh University Press, 2014, 197pp., $34.95 (pbk), ISBN 9780748684830.

Reviewed by Timothy A.D. Hyde, Stony Brook University


Is phenomenology dead? Has it been killed off by Speculative Realism and Object Oriented Ontology (OOO)? Do those movements at least have phenomenology in their sights or are they merely a throwback to a pre-critical age? Or, once everything suspect is removed from them, are they not just a continuation of phenomenology? Tom Sparrow's book takes a stand on these questions, not only by suggesting that phenomenology is dead, by its own hand, no less, if not stillborn, but also by arguing that the method essential to phenomenological means that, almost by definition, no continental philosophical realism can be phenomenological.

Philosophy that relies too heavily on the way it defines its terms, however, is never satisfying, and this book comes perilously close to defining phenomenology in such a way as to exclude the realistic elements in it. If one defines phenomenology as anti-realist and speculative realism as realist then, of course, the two are mutually exclusive. But there certainly are realistic tendencies in Heidegger, as Graham Harman frequently stresses. The same is true of Merleau-Ponty, and the theological turn of Jean-Luc Marion, Michel Henry and Levinas claims to have some access to the absolute other as other. Of course, the question isn't whether phenomenologists claim to be realist, because phenomenologists frequently repeat that they are not idealist. The question is, as Sparrow repeatedly stresses, whether they are actually able to escape idealism.

There are two parts to this book: a broad-brush attack on phenomenology and, from chapter three onwards, a broad-brush overview of various philosophical approaches loosely lumped under the heading of speculative realism. While I am sympathetic to this project, both parts have shortcomings. I think that Sparrow's criticism of phenomenology only really sticks to Husserl, thus leaving the possibility that later phenomenology is more contiguous with speculative realism than Sparrow's analysis would suggest. And the second part doesn't analyze the speculative realism movement as a whole or address the individual thinkers critically.

It would be a little otiose to summarize a summary of Quentin Meillassoux (ch.3), Graham Harman (ch.4) and Levi Bryant, Timothy Morton, Ian Bogost, Jane Bennett and Iain Hamilton Grant (ch.5), so all I am going to say is that the summaries of the thinkers I know well are accurate, so, to paraphrase Socrates, I assume the others are too. But the very fact that it would be odd to re-summarize this part of the book raises a question. What is the purpose of these summaries, who is their intended audience? Presumably not someone who has read Harman's The Quadruple Object, Meillassoux's After Finitude, and Grant's Philosophies of Nature After Schelling. But they must be intended for a moderate proponent of phenomenology, since it would surely be redundant to try to convince a Daniel Dennett that phenomenology as a methodology is bust. But given that, the thinkers are handled so briefly and uncritically that it is hard to imagine that even a moderately sympathetic reader is going to be swayed. Perhaps even more importantly, many of these author's works are admirably concise and accessible. The Quadruple Object weighs in at 157 pages, and After Finitude at 160, and neither of them uses particularly small print. If anyone is interested in an introduction to speculative realism, those are surely the places to go. It might be worthwhile introducing the second generation of OOO such as Bryant, Morton, Bogost, and Bennet since they are probably less well known and could benefit by being introduced to a larger public. But the treatment of them is so cursory that it cannot serve such a purpose. A work such as this surely needs a critical engagement with the thinkers to really command an audience, as Sparrow admits, while saying that he has "not attempted to defend them" (190).

This is especially problematic because so much of speculative realism is a work in progress. Harman's use of metaphor and allusion to talk about the inner life of objects that we can never stand in any relation to is troubling. As is his need for vicarious causation between the inner life of his objects and their sensuous life, which are cut off from one another by definition. Meillassoux's philosophy is a promissory note. After Finitude is mainly negative. It sets up a problem but gives us no solution. Meillassoux's supposed Magnus Opus, Divine Inexistence, is an unpublished manuscript, bits of which make up part of Harman's Quentin Meillassoux: Philosophy in the Making. And Sparrow's Ray Brassier fails to explain how third-person scientific description will actually get at the "non-manifest dimension of phenomenality" (156). I am excited about many of these approaches to philosophy in the twenty-first century, but it is still far from clear that any of them are viable alternatives to phenomenology, even if we take it as given that phenomenology ultimately fails. A secondary work on them surely needs to tackle that question head on.

Not only do the speculative realists individually need to be handled more critically, so does the movement as a whole, especially since their individual systems are contrary to one another, if not outright contradictory. But there are other issues that need to be raised, too. Do all post-Kantian realisms have to be speculative and in what way, and are all of them speculative in the requisite sense? While Sparrow tells us in the preface, "I hope to provide here an account of the coherence that underlies [Speculative Realism's] diversity" (xii), nowhere does such an account surface. He tantalizingly asks, "of what does speculation consist?" (61), but his answer is, basically, "diverse approaches." In fact, by page 146 he has obviously given up addressing what speculation is, admitting that he won't address the relationship between realism and speculation. A work such as this needs an engagement with speculative realism as a movement bound together by something more than all having been at the same conference in 2007. And it is not as if Sparrow doesn't understand this. As he puts it, "The specific difference between a realist and a speculative realist must be identified, otherwise speculative realism will meet a fate similar to that of phenomenology" (190).

What of the other part, Sparrow's analysis of phenomenology? He asks whether phenomenology is or can be realist. He then notes repeatedly that just saying that you are not an idealist doesn't make it so. Sparrow is also surely right that the standard phenomenologist's reply that phenomenology is beyond the idealism/realism dispute or that phenomenology is a realism if you only understand what "to be real" means are both profoundly unsatisfying responses. To decide what phenomenologists are allowed to claim, we need to understand how phenomenological description works. A description is only phenomenological if it takes place "from within some form of methodological reduction that shifts the focus of the description to the transcendental . . . level" (14). Thus, any phenomenology must follow Husserl's "Principle of Principles," which involves describing things as they are immanently given to us. The only candidate for a non-Husserlian phenomenological method or style is something like a shared respect for concreteness, or access to the rich elsewhere through various forms of resistance we find in the phenomenal sphere. Sparrow argues that a rhetoric of concreteness is not sufficient to make such "phenomenology" philosophical, let alone realist; and, although much too briefly, that phenomena such as surprise are insufficient to allow us to make claims about the existence of something beyond a world correlated with subjectivity.

What Sparrow proves, it seems to me, is that Husserlian phenomenology, if it had been what Husserl wanted it to be, namely, a rigorous science, would be anti-realist; but since Husserl never gave us a definitive explication of the method and everyone else has pretty much given up on it, the "method for philosophy as strict science" has never existed (185). But this hardly implies that post-Husserlian phenomenology is anti-realist. In fact, it doesn't even imply that Husserl was anti-realist. It implies that he was a failed anti-realist, and given the radical break between the Husserlian project and most of post-Husserlian phenomenology, perhaps what Sparrow shows is that we shouldn't call post-Husserlian phenomenology "phenomenology" at all. I have long thought that Husserl can be usefully thought of as the last enlightenment thinker in the tradition of Kant, and Heidegger, Merleau-Ponty and the so-called theological phenomenologists, as counter-enlightenment thinkers going back to the likes of Hamann and Jacobi. If Sparrow had used this schema, he would have realized that he needed to spend much more time proving that the brush he tars Husserl with works against everyone else.

Sparrow's analysis of Heidegger displays the problem of defining phenomenology so narrowly. On the one hand, having defined phenomenology as the anti-realist transcendental phenomenology of Husserl -- assuming for the moment that it is such -- much, in fact most, of Heidegger is, of course, not phenomenology. So while one can admit that one can find in later Heidegger many resources for realism (39), it can't be produced as evidence that phenomenology has a streak of realism. On the other hand, Sparrow wants to include all of Heidegger under the umbrella of phenomenology so as to oppose him to speculative realism, which is effectively an umbrella term for post-phenomenological realisms. The correct conclusion, of course, should, rather, be that Heidegger, by that definition, is a speculative realist. But that would take the wind out of the sails of the new kids on the block. If it doesn't make sense to call Heidegger a speculative realist, and it makes some sense as Harman proves, it is because it makes no sense to suggest that nine-tenths of Heidegger is not phenomenological.

As it is, Sparrow has two criticisms of Heidegger. The first is based on the centrality of dasein to the question of the meaning of being in Being and Time. The second is based on Heidegger's criticism of metaphysics. To criticize Being and Time as too stuck in a transcendental paradigm is really to forget that the bit of Being and Time that we have is only preparatory. The being it gets at is the meaning of being on the basis of the being of dasein. Only after that project was Heidegger suppose to get to the meaning of being überhaupt. The criticism of Heidegger's early approach as a criticism of Heidegger in general is even more unreasonable since, arguably, Heidegger comes to realize that his approach in Being and Time is still too tainted with transcendental residue from Husserl to allow him to get to where he wanted to go  Therefore, he has to radicalize his approach -- although the "formal indication" in his early lectures indicates how he hoped to, if I may say it, speculate about being itself during this early period -- which, of course, under Sparrow's definition would not be phenomenological either. Sparrow's suggestion (39), following Lee Braver, that Heidegger's criticism of metaphysics as ontotheology is radically anti-realist misses the mark even more. Traditional realism is a metaphysics of presence. A metaphysics of presence is a metaphysics for which the real is either utterly presently present or eternally present in such a way that time drops out of the picture. That sort of realism is, for Heidegger, wildly misguided, as is any epistemological realism that stems from it. But it does not follow from Heidegger's lifelong criticism of metaphysics that philosophy becomes human-centric, as the "Letter on Humanism" shows and Sparrow notes (40). What follows from it is that we need to think of being in terms of temporality (in terms of Temporalität not merely the Zeitlichkeit of dasein) or as event. I will return to this temporal aspect of ontology in a moment.

One of two loci of realism in phenomenology is to be found, as Sparrow notes, in some form of resistance (Merleau-Ponty (15), Heidegger (43)), saturation (Marion (17)), or surprise (Levinas (57)), a trick we have been trying not just since Dilthey and Scheler (43), but all the way back to Fichte, at the very least. Sparrow spends most of his time designating these attempts as non-phenomenological. But whether they are phenomenological in Sparrow's sense or not is immaterial. What matters is whether such attempts to escape the transcendental idealism of Husserl succeed, but Sparrow spends only half a dozen short paragraphs engaging this question directly (57-59). Yet his entire thesis depends on whether such resistances indicate ruptures and hence the Other, or whether they merely appear within a horizon of our expectations, in which case we are firmly in the land of idealism. Everything hangs on whether "What resists phenomenology within us -- natural being, the 'barbarous' source that Schelling spoke of -- cannot remain outside phenomenology and should have its place within it" (154), or whether we do in fact have to go, say, with the neo-Schellingen approach of Grant or some other neo-Hegelian approach to nature (189). Rather than making this argument central to the book, Sparrow soon returns to pointing out that such claims are not phenomenological in the Husserlian sense of the term, which, of course, could well be true, but they still leave, e.g., Levinas a non-Husserlian phenomenological realist.

This leaves us with Sparrow's claim that a methodological reduction is what links phenomenology together as a philosophical approach, and that a rhetoric of concreteness -- the other candidate -- fails to make a description philosophical, let alone realist. Otherwise, as he cheekily points out, we might as well consider Melville as a phenomenologist of whaling (5). But, as Sparrow also notes, Husserl famously never got "to the specification of a determinate phenomenological method, and many of his followers famously gave up on it" (189). In fact, not only did we never get a finalized version of the methodology of philosophy as rigorous science, but also later phenomenology rejected a complete reduction as impossible. But if phenomenology gives up on the reduction, how is it still phenomenology? Later phenomenologies are such because they, like so many of the speculative realists, argue that you still have to go through Husserl or some form of correlationism.

Later phenomenologists mine the implications of the impossibility of a complete reduction. All later phenomenologies are phenomenologies only in opposition to Husserl. We only call them phenomenology because they work on the corpse of Husserl's phenomenology. We have to endlessly return to the question of what phenomenology is (44) and continually bring the reduction itself into a reduction. As Sparrow tellingly puts it, working off Merleau-Ponty, phenomenology as a method "is impossible because it must infinitely return to and reflect on its beginning, which means it can never begin" (48). His mistake is telling. The correct inference is, rather, that phenomenology could never have begun. It can, in fact must always, be re-attempting to begin. Phenomenology can always have a future; what it cannot have is a past. Or as Heidegger puts it in "My Way to Phenomenology," quoting himself from Being and Time, phenomenology's "essential character does not consist in being actual as a philosophical school. Higher than actuality stands possibility. The comprehension of phenomenology consists in grasping it as possibility."

There is a temporal dimension to being and the thinking of being, which interestingly enough comes out in this very dispute. For Meillassoux, we have to be able to think about the reality of a time prior to any possible givenness, a time in which givenness arises. For Kant, as well as Husserl, the meaning of the term reality must involve things that can be given to some subjectivity in the present or some future present. But there is a third option. Being and the philosophy that tries to think it could be essentially and ineluctably futural. Later phenomenology doesn't give up on the reduction; later phenomenology only gives up on a rigorous predefined method. As Sparrow himself remarks,

If we attribute sufficient importance to the role that methodology plays in philosophy, then I think that we must always remain on guard when a phenomenologist begins to talk about the prereflective, prepersonal, preperceptual and above all transcendent things. (75)

Quite. That is the problem with methodological purity. Dominique Janicaud is right, and Sparrow is right to quote him, writing that Levinas "is the abandonment of the phenomenological method, a farewell to the Husserlian ambition of rigor" (53). But for later phenomenology, this is precisely what the failure of Husserl requires.

So what of the rhetoric of concreteness? Sparrow notes that "the attachment to realism is palpable in phenomenology's rhetoric [of concreteness], but is this attachment philosophically justified?" (70). The answer is, of course, no. Methodological justification is what is forsworn by later phenomenology. I think we can say that later phenomenology has a method without a methodology. Concrete life must be lived through by the phenomenologist and each and every one of us in turn, not merely talked or theorized about. Similarly, carnal phenomenology poetically creates an atmosphere to evoke our embodied immersion in the elemental (78-79). Like all poetry, it can be read as an assemblage of rhetorical devices, but that is not how to read poetry poetically, and the question at hand is, if such poetry can be read philosophically, to give us an appreciation of the prereflective, prepersonal, preperceptual ground of all things. The difference between this approach to philosophy and Melville is that these descriptions are within a reduction, albeit an incomplete reduction; that is, a reduction of that very reduction and a discourse that must attune itself to the matter to be thought rather than dictate to the matter to be thought how it must be thought. As Heidegger puts it in "The End of Philosophy," "For it is not yet decided in what way that which needs no proof in order to become accessible to thinking is to be experienced."

Sparrow is right that if phenomenology sticks to the Husserlian project, it can only remain in an idealist orbit. Ironically, what his work makes clear by implication is that for this very reason we need to think of later phenomenology as not only rejecting the Husserlian project, but rejecting any sense that philosophy should rely on a fixed justified pre-given method. For that is the only way it can hope to escape idealism. Whether it is ultimately successful, or whether some version of the many speculative realisms will be more philosophically fecund, is, however, yet to be decided.