The End of Progress: Decolonizing the Normative Foundations of Critical Theory

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Amy Allen, The End of Progress: Decolonizing the Normative Foundations of Critical Theory, Columbia University Press, 2016, 280pp., $35.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780231173247.

Reviewed by John J. Davenport, Fordham University


Amy Allen identifies two main goals for her book. The first is to critique Habermas and two of his main successors -- Axel Honneth and Rainer Forst -- as "wedded to problematically Eurocentric and/or foundationalist strategies for grounding normativity," including implicitly "colonialist" notions of intellectual and social progress. The second is to "decolonize Frankfurt School critical theory" by offering alternative bases for normativity that take on board the concerns of "decolonial theory," critical race theory, and queer theory that have been sidelined by mainstream critical theorists (p. xii). Her argumentative strategy is to set up a trilemma (see pp. 13-15):

a. the "long-standing" problem of relativism, of which postcolonial theory is accused;
b. justifying rational autonomy or social freedom as outcomes of "a progressive process of social evolution or sociocultural learning," which turns out to depend on a problematic conception of progress already accomplished; and
c. rationalist foundationalism (e.g. of neo-Kantian varieties) which ties political philosophy to ideal theory and makes social criticism into a form of "applied ethics."

Allen's thesis is that in trying to avoid horns (a) and (c), Habermas and Honneth each fall into two variants of horn (b): they try to avoid the "twin evils of foundationalism and relativism" by reconstructing the norms emerging from the implicit trajectory of social history (pp. 13-14). While Allen agrees with grounding critical theory in the actual social world, she argues that their versions depend on a (morally and factually) suspect idea of progress. Forst, by contrast, holds that "progress" is a normative concept depending on universal standards rather than supporting them. But he thereby falls into horn (c) in Allen's view, while she hopes to avoid all three horns by returning to a more contextualist view inspired by Adorno and Foucault.

Although I do not think she is entirely fair to them, I will not evaluate Allen's interpretations of Habermas and Honneth in detail. Instead, given space limits, I will concentrate on her critique of their reliance on "backward-looking" or accomplished progress, e.g. as Honneth thinks is evinced by growing acceptance of gay marriage, and on Allen's alternative proposal. Overall, I will argue that Critical Theory can reject excessively ideological and exaggerated charges of "colonialism," though I will express cautious sympathy with some of Allen's doubts about dependence on any strongly structured or stage-wise conception of human history.

Allen's main argument is that, despite rejecting rationalist ideas of necessary or teleologically determined historical progress (in Kant, Hegel, and Marx), much recent work in Critical Theory depends on an idea of historical progress "that has led up to 'us,'" or to our institutions, practices, and conception of reason. This idea of progress as an accomplished "fact" is more dangerous in her view than forward-looking or prospective progress "as a normative goal that we are striving to achieve," e.g. a "good" or "more just" society (p. 12). Her hope is to show that critical theory need not depend on backward-looking progress (pp. 32-33). However, if we can define a moral ideal without appeal to accomplished progress, we could then measure past progress with respect to that ideal. So Allen's real concern seems not to be with backward-looking progress per se, but rather with appeal to such progress to justify moral norms or ethical ideals.

In any case, the Allen explains two kinds of objections to past or accomplished progress. One is epistemological: "On what basis do we claim to know what counts as progress?" (p. 19). The second objection concerns the "entwinement of the idea of historical progress with the legacies of racism, colonialism, and imperialist and their contemporary neocolonial or informally imperialist forms" (p. 16). This refers to the familiar worry that seeing western cultures as more socially (as well as technologically) "advanced" provided a key ideological justification for "the colonial and imperial projects" (p. 17).  There are some historical problems with this argument; for example, slavery existed in Moorish parts of Spain and in North Africa before the conquistadors set out. Still, there is no doubt that cultural superiority was later invoked as a justification for empire as late as the establishment of colonial mandates under the League of Nations in the early 20th century.

But the fundamental problem with this critique of accomplished progress as inherently colonialist is that a historical thesis A may be used to justify a policy B that it does not entail. 19th century conservatives sometimes pressed Darwinian biology into service to justify extreme forms of meritocratic competition on the view that "weaker" individuals should die off. That social Darwinists perverted Darwin's findings in this way, or that Nazi doctors used them as specious rationalizations for eugenic programs, should hardly lead us to reject evolutionary biology because it is "deeply entwined" with the legacy of racial or class "supremacism."

Allen is aware of this worry: she notes that, even if backward-looking progress has used for corrupt ideological purposes in the past, it might not be "merely ideological" (p. 25). To illustrate this possibility, she briefly considers Thomas McCarthy's recent classic, Race, Empire, and the Idea of Human Development. She concedes that McCarthy goes beyond Habermas's admission that judgments of progress are situated and fallible, further emphasizes the need to remember the wrongs done "in the name of human development," and understands the norms embedded in our tradition(s) in a "more modest and contextualist way than . . . Habermas tends to" (pp. 27). Yet McCarthy agrees with Habermas that modern law, markets, and discourse have become unavoidable for practically everyone, and that we cannot avoid regarding the linguistic / historicist turn -- together with the reflexivity of "modern forms of discourse" -- as progressive, relative to which unreflective ways of life count as less advanced.

Despite the broad empirical evidence for McCarthy's position, Allen follows James Tully in calling his kind of view "neo-Kantian imperialism." This is a great example of ad hominem labeling, a dialectical fallacy that abounds in much recent postmodern work, including critical race studies, postcolonial theory, and some work on humanitarianism (see my critique of Fabrice Weissman for more examples). It is offensive and misleading to call a scholar like McCarthy, who has spent his life fighting injustice, "imperialist." Allen cites McCarthy's claim that we cannot simply abandon the theory and practice of development in part because of the moral imperative to organize programs "on behalf of the poorest and most vulnerable societies (p. 29). This implies, she says, that the poorest cannot represent themselves and need to be developed for their own good (p. 30). Is this a willful misinterpretation? McCarthy clearly did not mean that western nations should impose some kind of economic or social development on the least-developed nations (LDCs). Moreover LDCs themselves lobby hardest to stress rights to economic development in international documents and pledges.

Returning to the trilemma, Habermas and Honneth both claim that the "modern, European, Enlightenment moral vocabulary and moral ideals are neither merely conventional nor grounded in some a priori, transcendental conception of pure reason" (p. 14). Allen agrees with their suspicion of rationalist foundationalism, but not with the pragmatist idea, which they appear to share with John Dewey and perhaps the later Rawls, that an ongoing process of learning and discovery yielding more effective solutions to social problems is an important criterion of practical "validity."

Allen argues persuasively that Habermas's theory of modernity and social progress is at least part of the justification of his discourse ethics (p. 66). She objects that Habermas is reconstructing "the intuitive knowledge of a very specific group of people, namely 'competent members of modern societies,'" whose implicit norms are not universal across history or culture (p. 51). This is a reasonable concern, given Habermas's stated aim of putting "critical theory on a sound normative footing" (p. 52). But in response, Habermas could say that the implicit presuppositions of communicative action that he reconstructs are universal to all joint practical reasoning aimed at truth, which must be a cooperative endeavor: this held as much for Socrates and Confucius as for westerners today and the Azande debating evidence of witchcraft (on this, see Kwame Anthony Appiah's Cosmopolitanism chs. 5-6).

If Habermas needs a theory of historical advances in the past to support his formal pragmatics (derived from Robert Alexy) and thus his principles D and U, I want to suggest that a better theory of the so-called "Axial" transition at the dawn of monotheistic religions could be sufficient for this purpose. As Allen notes, Habermas now traces the turn towards reflexivity back to the transformations of the Axial Age (p. 72); but Habermas does not spell out all the aspects in the Axial transition through which many cultures passed. In each instance, the Axial shift involves the emergence of a kind of value that is distinct from outward success in battle (or power); virtue becomes an inward trait less subject to luck than is the charisma of aristocratic leaders; social roles are assigned more according to acquired merits than by birth-caste; justice comes to refer to the common good; and portrayals of the gods shift so that the divine will accords with what is objectively good rather than determining what is good by free decree. In short, to Nietzsche's consternation, might no longer makes right. The Axial in this sense is hardly Eurocentric; it refers to a transition that we find in virtually all cultures. Further support for this could be derived from Hans Blumenberg's massive defense of the possibility of "simple progress" in The Legitimacy of the Modern Age, but this does not come up in Allen's study.

This also provides a response to the challenge that Allen cites from Dipesh Chakrabarty, who claims that dialogical openness to "non-Western others" requires a stance that does not structure the encounter according to any prior implicit commitments (pp. 75-76). The Axial reference point suggests that there will always be shared implicit commitments, unless the "other" simply holds that his power rules without limit. And that stance is not a non-Western culture; it is simply the root of limitless violence that returns in various individuals and epochs among all cultures everywhere -- in Bashar al-Assad as much as Genghis Khan. By contrast, to want openness and dialogue is already to have embraced the Axial turn.

Turning to Honneth, Allen convincingly argues that he justifies the normative force of his conditions for "full ethical self-realization" within social relations by holding that this kind of self-realization is the outcome of a historical progression (pp. 81-82). Although Honneth does not say it, she takes this to imply that modern Western societies are "developmentally superior" not only to feudal European orders but to currently existing nonmodern societies (p. 83) -- if any totally nonmodern societies exist. To this, we might ask, "superior in what sense?" The accumulation of knowledge over time is one possibility (p. 87), as are goods of non-domination.

However, because Honneth has rejected transcendental and constructivist justifications of the norms central to his critical theory, Allen thinks he is caught on the horns of a dilemma: if these conditions based on his philosophical anthropology hold only within specific forms of "ethical life," they succumb to the charge of conventionalism; but if they are meant to be "context-independent and universal," then they violate Honneth's pledge to base normativity within the immanent social world and its history. I agree; this analysis is one of the strongest parts of Allen's book -- until it turns to gay marriage.

In Freedom's Right, Honneth takes legalization of gay marriage to be a further step in moral-political progress (p. 89). Allen concedes that to side with gay marriage is to judge that this is better than the institutional and social alternatives according to "some normative principle or value;" moreover, it "may very well mean that I am committed to some understanding of the possibility of moral or political progress" such as equality before the law (p. 97). But if so, then it will surely also be possible to recognize past instances of progress on the same scale, e.g. the 14th Amendment -- confirming that her main objection cannot be to the possibility of accomplished progress per se. Rather, in this case, Allen objects that Honneth "clearly takes committed, monogamous, long-term relationships as the paradigm cases for intimate relationships" (p. 99) which lays him open to a "queer-left" critique.

Honneth certainly needs to strengthen his moral psychology with a fuller account of the structures of caring and love that could help defend the legal privileges given to marriage as a protection for long-term monogamous commitments. But I cannot agree with Allen that Honneth's perception of progress in this case is "heteronormative" because it "privileges a bourgeois-romantic conception of heterosexual marriage," or that it is "homonormative" in privileging "those queer relationships that most closely approximate to this [hetero] ideal" (p. 100). First, this is another instance of tendentious labeling that has no place in philosophy. Second, Honneth's view privileges long-term monogamous relationships over 'brief and loose' encounters among both heterosexual and homosexual couples in the same way; there is no evident reason to think that long-term monogamous devotion is essentially "heterosexual," and this suggestion demeans committed love among homosexual couples by suggesting that they are just trying to fulfill some "hetero" social-script. Similarly, there is no good reason to consider committed monogamous relationships "bourgeois." Modern canons of romance originated from the courtly love genre in the 13th and 14th centuries before the bourgeois existed; and they were further developed by 18th and 19th century European novelists like Jane Austen precisely to praise marriage for love over bourgeois marriage for wealth and family connections.

To be fair, Allen is not opposing gay marriage here; her worry is about the implication that our "late modern, European-American form of ethical life is superior to those forms of life that do not tolerate or accept gay marriage" (p.100). I concur with this concern, at least insofar as putting gay marriage on the top of the human rights agenda risks alienating a large majority of people in many non-western cultures who fear that westerners are trying to impose extreme sexual mores on them. It is one thing to insist that non-hetero individuals be free from physical abuse, legal sanctions, and or even social ostracism. But to insist on gay marriage makes it easy for dictators to portray human rights in general as a slippery slope to chaos. Yet this strategic insight is not Allen's point. Instead, she follows Jasbir Puar's suggestion that "heteronormativity and nationalism have been intertwined over the last twenty years," and that people use the "greater cultural and legal recognition for homosexuality" to underwrite the "the national and transnational agendas of US imperialism" (p. 101).

Puar's statement here seems absurd: it sounds like something right out of Putin's playbook. Some westerners may derive a smug sense of cultural superiority from their nations' acceptance of gay relations or even gay marriage. But most informed Americans and Europeans realize that this is a very recent phenomenon in our cultures and still faces significant opposition; they do not "disavow homophobia" at home by "projecting it onto other spaces" (p. 102). I cannot recall anyone arguing that our greater recognition of gay rights is evidence of a moral superiority that gives us the right to go to war to promote American trade interests. Certainly western politicians have sometimes called on nations like Saudi Arabia and Uganda to stop jailing and threatening to execute practicing gays, but no one has suggested this as a reason even for trade sanctions (though maybe it should be). Even more puzzling is Allen's claim that our acceptance of monogamous, committed homosexual relationships marginalizes or excludes "other sexual minorities, especially racially or ethnically marked and working class queers" (p. 102). I'm not quite sure what this means: is she suggesting that western cultures approve gay relationships only among rich white yuppies?

Overall, this section is the kind of thing that gives Foucaultian postmodernism a bad name: it feels like the author is straining to be more avant-garde than the mainstream voices in favor of gay marriage by weaving sophisticated associations between ideas and attitudes that insinuate previously unsuspected "relations of power" with potentially sinister implications. Readers are expected to be impressed by such insinuations, just as they are expected to find it profound when the author claims to detects a "gap" or "crack" in ordinary thinking that allegedly reveals its "repressed other" or unconscious dominations. So a reasonable worry about inferring cultural superiority from acceptance of gay marriage is swamped among non-sequiters drawn from contingent associations. That nations which recognize gay rights have also been imperialist in the past does not suggest any nefarious "intertwining" or "intersection" between accepting gay marriage and "cultural imperialism" (p. 103), let alone political imperialism. Like tropes of "entanglement" in postcolonialist works, these terms are red flags: they signal that an invalid inference from accidental juxtapositions is probably coming next.

As with Habermas and Honneth, Allen gives a clear account of Forst's approach to critical theory, distinguishing their positions in a way that should be helpful to newcomers as well as interesting to old hands in these debates. Forst stresses that reconstructing a conception of the right from "familiar conceptions" cannot be what validates it; instead, the basis must lie in "the demands of practical reason itself" (pp. 123-24). In his view, however the concept of progress has been misused in the past, progress remains an imperative demanded by those suffering systemic wrongs: "the critique of oppressive or colonizing notions of progress itself presumes that self-determination is normatively desirable" (pp. 127-28), or that mere coercion is wrong. As Allen explains, Forst expects first-order reasons that will be tested for universalizability to come from our identities and communities in the form of "ethical" values that are limited or filtered by the moral criteria (p. 133). This allows for a certain level of context-sensitivity, as Allen notes, in the verdicts arising from application of the basic moral requirement in different societies.

To this, Allen objects that claims about "what it means to be a practical reasoner" at all can be arbitrary or universalize what is really a parochial view. Who is the "we" whose practical use of reason being reconstructed here, and does this focus deny value in embodied affects, emotions, or imagination (p. 137)? To such familiar concerns, it seems that Forst might respond as Christine Korsgaard has by insisting that our use of practical reason in making choices to act always inevitably endorses its own value. On this view, we can come to see that moral reasons are autonomous or naturally endorsed, not forced on us. Instead Allen argues, following Adorno, that Forst is too sanguine about the moral motive aiming at reciprocal fairness for its own sake, and that children have to be socialized with a degree of coercion. I think empirical psychology has undermined such doubts about fairness-motivation. Even if she is right that Forst needs to say more about socialization, we need not conclude with Foucault that "the space of reasons is . . . always already the space of power" (p. 143). Most children require external incentives to learn math beyond simple counting, but that does not make mathematical truths into subtle artifices of "power;" it merely shows that developing the mental capacities needed to understand and appreciate these truths at first requires other incentives, which can be left behind when the capacities are developed.

To clarify, I'm hardly denying that children's identities and values are shaped by all sorts of values, often including some that decolonial and communitarian critiques legitimately question. The issue is whether there are sources of upbringing that are autonomy-enabling, or whether all the ultimate sources of reasons for which we might act lack any intrinsic authority beyond their causal efficacy in our psyches. Allen's goal is not to plumb the depths of this difficult question, but she seems to infer from the mere existence of the question that Forst's solution is inadequate. Instead, I suggest that the burden of proof goes both ways: it makes little sense to criticize "dominance" and "hegemony" if there is no possible alternative (p. 143). How can colonialism be "pernicious" (p. 146) if reasoning as we know it is merely a conduit of forces that manipulate our minds?

Similarly, I am unmoved by Allen's suggestion that criticisms from "feminist, queer, postcolonial, and critical race theorists" demonstrate that "the Kantian Enlightenment conception of practical reason explicitly or implicitly excludes, represses, or dominates" whatever is symbolically associated with non-reason, including "black, queer, female, colonized, and subaltern subjects" (p. 137). This frequently-repeated list is mesmerizing like chant, but the claim is extreme: surely the error lies in not in the very idea of universalizability tests for fairness but rather in symbolic associations of such "marginalized" subjects with the irrational. Allen wants to critique such offensive associations and at the same time still rely on them to damn Kantian moral criteria as oppressing the "subaltern" other. Similarly, it makes no sense to claim that Forst exaggerates "reason's emancipatory potential and underemphasizes the subordinating power of justification," which rationalizes domination of "female, queer, and subaltern subjects as irrational" (p. 147). For any conception of reason that subordinated certain groups would not really be justificatory: thus Allen is attacking a straw man.

In addition, while Allen reiterates the familiar complaint that Kantian practical reasoning is too "abstract" (perhaps conflating abstraction with universalization), these grievances on behalf of 'Reason's others' are themselves incredibly vague. Is the problem that Kant gives too little role to emotions or sentiment in moral thinking? If so, perhaps that can be corrected by a better version of Enlightenment practical reason, as much work in the last 50 years has argued. That critics in several genres have repeated these accusations so often that they have become utterly formulaic to the point of sounding canned does not "show" that they have been correct, or that our previous attempts to formulate practical reason have erred by being racist or exclusionary (p. 138). There is a kind of master-metaphor at work here, not only in Allen's texts but throughout her genre. It could be pictured like the images of Atlas holding up the world, or the bright gardens of the masters being held up by the slave underworld in Fritz Lang's famous Metropolis. But the postcolonialist master-metaphor puts Enlightenment Reason in place of Lang's master-class, implicitly depending on the suppressed Otherworld that subtends Reason: Atlas, or the slaves below, are now non-white, non-western, colonized, queer, transgendered, 'differently abled,' or whatever the most fashionable latest victim-category may be.

I have three worries about the surprising degree of reliance on this master-metaphor among recent postmodern authors, and the great seriousness with which it is now taken not only among many philosophers, but also sociologists, literary theorists, and their undergraduate students. First, it is simplistic: no such image can come close to capturing the complexity of real life. The symbolism can be helpful, but only up to a point (as Lang would have been the first to say). Second, it substitutes a rhetorical strategy for argument. Simply placing Reason in the oppressor-role in this image provides zero evidence that Reason is actually oppressive: it merely encourages readers to interpret any perceived injustice along these lines while ignoring rival, potentially much better, explanations. Third, as I noted above, it cultivates a kind of victimology that also aestheticizes the victim-categories: oppressed groups, reified into symbols, are so positioned that they seem to verify the poststructuralist idea that dominant concepts self-deconstruct or reveal through their internal aporias what lies beneath them, the undescribably different. That matters can be construed a certain way by insinuation hardly proves that they are that way, as any defense lawyer knows.

All that said, Allen may be correct that Forst gives an inadequate account of power that focuses too much on "justificatory power" or putative rational persuasion, and assimilates variant forms of subordination to duress to which the agent in some sense voluntarily accedes (pp. 148-49). Clearly not all power works through the "space of reasons" and subjects may be deformed or moulded to suit dominant elites in the very education that develops their capacities to reason (p. 150). On the other hand, the Foucaultian conception of power might be too expansive in the other direction, treating every type of interpersonal influence as a kind of manipulation. It becomes too easy on this view to assert "entanglements" or "intersections" between rational requirements for justification and this or that sort of alleged subordination, e.g. "implicit class bias" (p. 152). Allen notes Forst's countercharge that his critics belittle "subaltern subjects;" in my own experience, people do not need to have research credentials to be able to muster many (sometimes complex) arguments. In any case, Allen admits that Forst may be correct that "no one owns the concept of justification" (p. 157); she simply rejects Kantian explanations of it in favor of a loose family resemblance between modes of justification or explanation in different cultures.

Allen's own way of explaining values that can undergird critical assessments of power-relations within human society derives from Adorno and Foucault. She does a good job of explicating both. Allen patiently explains that Foucault is not arguing that unreason, let alone madness, are the only source of freedom. Rather, his point is to use moments of unreason to loosen up the grip of our "system of thought" on us, which helps enable freedom (p. 182). Unreason "opens up and illuminates lines of gaps and fissures . . . in our historical apriori" (pp. 182-83) without claiming an Archimedean vantage outside of it. (Note the master-metaphor at work again here). Similarly, Allen argues that Adorno is not denying any possibility of future progress, despite his suggestions that Enlightenment reason necessarily had to revert to domination and atrocity in some fashion or other. Perhaps Adorno thinks that Enlightenment reason contained the "germ of . . . regression" to barbarism because he equated it with instrumental reason or the cultivation of power over nature and other persons (p. 167). Yet Habermas and his successors have corrected this idea by distinguishing "communicative" from "strategic" rationality.

It is also not evident why Adorno thinks that reason cannot be divided from power at least in principle, or what norms the later Foucault can appeal to in critiquing our current practices and modes of thought. If we cannot even outline the utopia to be brought about by the "radical transformation" for which they call because we are too corrupt, it could lead to anything. So this "radically reflexive and historicized critical methodology that understands critique as the wholly immanent and fragmentary practice of opening up lines of fragility . . . within the social world" (p. 203) seems purely negative or ultimately empty. As Allen says, Foucault retains fidelity not to the Enlightenment's "doctrinal elements but to its critical attitude" (p. 191). That sounds good, but we should remember that the central "doctrine" of all Enlightenment moral theory from Locke onwards was the inalienability of liberty, i.e. even voluntary slavery is not legitimate: freedom without any limits inherent in its own constitutive conditions includes no inalienable rights. We confront here a central irony: there is a line from Nietzsche and Sartre to libertarianism (it was not for nothing that Ayn Rand admired Nietzsche). Honneth's and Forst's conceptions of agential autonomy, like Habermas's, instead have implicit moral limits built into them.