The Environment: Philosophy, Science, and Ethics

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William P. Kabasenche, Michael O'Rourke, and Matthew H. Slater (eds.), The Environment: Philosophy, Science, and Ethics, MIT Press, 2012, 316pp., $38.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780262017404.

Reviewed by Kendy M. Hess, College of the Holy Cross


Our collective interest in the environment has come a long way since Rachel Carson published Silent Spring in 1962. Specifically "our collective interest" has moved from the tip of the leftist fringe of society to claim a spot near the center. I don't mean to suggest that the environment is now a central concern for each of us (more's the pity). I'm simply pointing out that the vocabulary of the environment has been incorporated into the everyday language of everyday people, and that the animating concerns of environmentalism are weaving their way through the fabric of our communal life. Love it or hate it, "the environment" is now on the list with poverty, education, and the economy as a central social issue. This is all as it should be.

In the wake of this rising concern has come the uncomfortable realization that we don't really know what we're talking about, when it comes to "the environment." It's not just that we don't know all of the science of the environment, or the sociology and psychology of our interactions with it, or the history, economics, or politics of it. It's that we don't really know what we mean by "the environment", or how best to think and talk about it, or how to understand our relationship to it. Until we resolve some of those basic questions, all of our attempts at environmental science, policy, sociology, and the rest will be hampered.

The Environment is a helpful tool at this point. It presents fifteen essays covering an impressive array of subjects related to the environment -- all interesting, all relevant, and all (more or less) available to the non-specialist.The collection begins with an excellent introduction by Katie McShane. She provides a succinct, helpful survey (1-3) of the differing ideas and concerns that have shaped the mess (my word) that is our current, incoherent conception of "the environment" before moving on to provide the traditional synopsis of the essays to come.  

The first seven essays are from the viewpoint of one of three philosophical subdisciplines. Three are in philosophy of science including Robert Brandon's about the concept of the environment in evolutionary theory, Rachel Bryant's inquiry into whether ecological communities are wholes, and Denis Walsh's argument for what he calls "situated adaptationism." Two essays have a metaphysical orientation. Michael Trestman suggests that we consider the environment from a behavioral perspective and Brian Steverson discusses systems theory and the new ecophilosophy (both discussed below).  Two other essays focus on epistemological issues. In his discussion of climate change Jay Odenbaugh claims that "the fact that most scientists believe a proposition is true can be good evidence for others to believe that proposition" (10). Lorraine Code explores Rachel Carson's work. She argues that both Carson's work and her approach(es) to it imply radical epistemological claims about the situated nature of knowledge -- most particularly, about the situated nature of knowledge of nature. Generally, Carson's

focus on habitat as a place to know is central to my argument. Extrapolating beyond Carson's writing, I propose that social, political, cultural, and experiential elements figure alongside physical and (other) environmental contributors to the 'nature' of a habitat and its inhabitants, at any historical moment, and are therefore integral to conditions for the production and circulation of knowledge there. (119)

The last seven essays address questions of ethics, policy, and activism. The section begins with Joseph Cannon's interesting essay on Kant. He argues that Kant's directive to take an immediate interest in natural beauty is a directive to "tak[e] a moral interest in nature regarded as a person -- specifically as a being who wills the achievement of our moral character as its end" (151). This reading, he says, presents nature as a moral educator, "a person that sets ends for us that are duties for us", and that this gets us a strong environment ethic without forcing us to postulate nature as a person (152). I'm somewhat ambivalent about whether he pulls this off, but it's a very interesting read. Essays by Mariam Thalos and Chrisoula Andreou raise questions about the precautionary principle and the hazards of cost-benefit analysis, while Benjamin Hale, Clare Palmer, and Kristin Shrader-Frechette address the ethics of remediation (discussed below), reparations to nature, and the unacknowledged environmental costs of nuclear power.

The book concludes with Andrew Light's appeal for a broader philosophical engagement with actual environmental policy. To put his point more harshly than he himself does (or perhaps would): publishing academic articles and talking to each other at academic conferences accomplishes little. And yet we philosophers could do so much, if we would just move beyond these traditional academic areas of engagement. We have deeply specialized knowledge that is directly relevant to policy decisions, professional skills at communication and education, and (collectively) a veritable army of students eager for the chance to see that what they've learned can be used -- that it is relevant, and meaningful. After so many essays outlining the difficulties we face in understanding "the environment" -- much less the difficulties we face in actually doing something about it -- Light's optimistic call to action stands as a welcome conclusion.

The book is in some ways a rather awkward collection and I'm unsure about the intended audience. How many philosophers are really interested in the whole scope of environmental philosophy? (Perhaps more than I imagine.) There is nothing "introductory" about the essays. Each qualifies as cutting-edge scholarship on its respective issue. For me, that was a pleasure when it came to the ethics, politics, and some of the metaphysics, but to be completely honest, some of the science and economics made my eyes cross. All the essays were readable, and the authors had clearly gone to some effort to make them accessible to outsiders, but some were still pretty heavy going (again, for the non-specialist). Individual essays would undoubtedly be useful in a number of different (advanced) classes, and the book as a whole would be a great resource for your library, but I can't imagine using it as a textbook.

I have to admit that I found The Environment a challenging read. Its scope, coupled with the depth of analysis in unfamiliar fields, made for some hard going. Still, it was good to be challenged in this way -- to be reminded of the many metaphysical, epistemological, and axiological issues underlying the ethics and politics with which I am more familiar. The book is a great starting point for any professional philosopher interested in the environment. Individual essays provide an interesting entry point for anyone curious about the role her own philosophical discipline plays with respect to the topic. The book as a whole is a perhaps necessary reminder that all of us, whatever our philosophical specialty, have something to contribute to the cause.

Normally at this point I would summarize the book, outlining and responding to the author's argument(s), but that's not going to work here. Instead, I've chosen to comment on three essays that I found particularly interesting.

Hale, "Getting the Bad Out."  Hale begins with a fascinating point: the simple fact that you have made an environmental mess does not, in fact, entail that you either should or may clean it up (223). However destructive the initial impact, as time passes the altered area is once again incorporated into the lives and expectations of various entities around it. A mining site abandoned for fifty years "may have taken on a different importance or meaning" as bears colonize it, rodents come to depend upon it for shelter, and trees and plants return (231). These post-impact interests are relevant to the question of what should be done, and efforts to "remediate" the site to its pre-impact state may violate those interests. Whether there is an obligation -- or even permission -- to remediate will turn in part on whether one has retained "some manner of moral jurisdiction" (225): "As our actions slip from our control, they impact and intermingle more and more with others . . . as the impact of one's actions intermingle with the interests of others, the justificatory burden [for intervention] grows greater" (236). Building on that point, Hale argues that the question is not only whether remediation is permissible but which remediation technologies are permissible (224). He ultimately concludes that "appropriate intervention comes only through technologies that shift the world back from State Y to State X, and not on to a third State Z" while reminding us that there may be situations where "it isn't immediately permissible to bring the world all the way back to State X" (225).

All of this was great, and I was quite taken with Hale's suggestion that agency "dissipates" (lovely image). My difficulties with the article had to do almost exclusively with Hale's repeated insistence that the permissibility of actions turns on the reasons for which they are pursued -- e.g., the claim that agents' "responsibility lies with their action -- particularly with the reasons for their action -- and not solely with the effects of their action" (235). Throughout, it was unclear to me what might constitute a "reason for action" in the sense that Hale intends, though I understand that these reasons must "meet with the wide reflective scrutiny of all affected parties, human and non-human, living and non-living" (238). Sometimes the word seemed to suggest ends, or goals; other times it seemed to suggest principles, in a kind of Rawlsian move; still other times it seemed to suggest the more familiar "actual motivations." All of these are perfectly good meanings but they are hardly synonymous, and different readings yield different -- and more or less plausible -- interpretations of some of Hale's claims. I would like to see a longer treatment that cleared this up.

Steverson, "Systems Theory and the New Ecophilosophy." Early environmental philosophy focused heavily on concerns about the existence and metaphysical character of various entities, particularly ecosystems. Recent work claims to abandon these efforts as misguided, turning instead to developing a practical framework to facilitate "a convergence of minds and commitments at the level of policy formation" (74). As Steverson points out, however, this new convergence has grown around the idea of sustaining ecosystem health. The new convergence may (or may not) be good policy, but philosophically it simply reintroduces the original questions of existence and character while doing little to advance the discussion. Even in the new ecophilosophy, we still need an account of ecosystems that is realist enough to be "healthy" without being "too realist" (80). Ecosystems "need to be semi-real" (84), and we still need to do the philosophical work to explain what that will entail. Steverson rejects efforts to draw analogies to inorganic dissipative structures (82-84) and gestures toward human communities as potential analogs -- things that, like ecosystems, aren't adequately captured by work at an individualistic level but seem unable support claims of ontological independence. He ultimately rejects this analog as well, and concludes that more work is required.

This article was beautifully written and provided a helpful survey of efforts-to-date to deal with this difficulty (and Steverson certainly convinced me that it's a difficulty). I think he moved too quickly in dismissing human communities ("collectives") as helpful analogs, though. He rules them out because "their existence is due to the collective interaction of the intentional decisions and actions of the individual humans composing them" (84). This is true, but I fail to see how it undermines the analogy. The mechanism by which collectives integrate and function -- intentional action -- is certainly different than the mechanism(s) by which ecosystems integrate and function, but the goal here is not to understand the mechanism. The goal is to understand what it means to say that a material -- and yet distributed -- object exists, and to determine what kinds of properties it is competent to bear. Can it have weight, a surface, an age? Can it behave, or even act? And of course, can it be healthy? The social ontology literature is engaged in a lively debate over precisely these questions as they pertain to collectives, and more dialogue between these two literatures would be fruitful for everybody.

Trestman, "The Environment, from a Behavioral Perspective." Michael Trestman argues that we should stop talking about what counts as behavior and "consider what it means to understand a system as behaving". The debate could then focus on when it would be appropriate to adopt "a behavioral stance" -- a kind of methodological holism (61). Trestman's response to the issue: when the system in question possesses a coherent goal structure (63). Such a structure requires goals and coherence, and Trestman provides accounts of both. A system possesses a goal when certain outcomes of its behavior are "robust with respect to [a] range of possible situations" -- when the system is constructed such that flexibility in the execution of sub-processes, "or the ability to cause the result in a variety of ways, buffers the result (in the sense that it ensures that the result obtains across a wide range of possible circumstances where otherwise it would fail)" (59). Multiple goals are "coherent" when "the system's 'goals' (understood as targets of directive correlation of that system's parts or aspects) [are] interrelated, and related to the environment, as a robust structure of mutual buffering" (65). In such cases it is valuable to adopt the behavioral stance toward the system for the same reason that we adopt this stance in ethology: because "the goal structure of a system's behavior is more readily observable than the fine causal structure of its component mechanisms" (63). Trestman points out that his approach accounts for our tendency to treat various entities -- even colonies of insects and teams of animals -- as "behaving" (66-69), but he draws the line at ecological communities (70).

I appreciate Trestman's desire to draw the line somewhere, but think he may have moved too quickly in dismissing ecological communities. He rejects the possibility of ecological communities "behaving" because they would have to be "highly integrated, to a degree that is probably very rare" (70). But the extent and intensity of "integration" is likely to depend on the spatial and temporal horizon within which it is considered. In the familiar space and time of immediate human experience, communities are made up of scattered parts that interact with each other only intermittently. Yet, from the perspective of a microscopic particle, the human body itself would be made up of scattered parts, and looked at microsecond by microsecond, these scattered parts would interact only intermittently. Alternatively, viewed from sufficient distance and year by year, we might find that a great many ecological communities are sufficiently "highly integrated." Obviously we ourselves interact with the world within a human horizon, but we cannot let the limits of our perception set the limits of our philosophical conceptions. We make the world smaller than it is when we assume that our own limited perspective captures something essential about reality, and I suspect that recognizing larger systems as "behaving" in their own right would enrich both our study and our experience of it.