The Epistemic Dimensions of Ignorance

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Rik Peels and Martijn Blaauw (eds.), The Epistemic Dimensions of Ignorance, Cambridge University Press, 2016, 217pp., $99.99 (hbk), ISBN 9781107175600.

Reviewed by Katja Maria Vogt, Columbia University


For those readers who judge this book by its remarkable cover, feel free to skip to the end of the review. For those who try not to, let's pursue the epistemic benefits of attending to the book's content. Rik Peels and Martijn Blaauw, the editors, are to be commended for their choice of topic. In their Introduction, they describe ignorance as almost absent from epistemology and as worthy of more attention than it receives. They conceive of the volume as a "first step" toward a fuller epistemology of ignorance (11). The book is charming in coming across as almost a collaboration among friends. This is a plus, insofar as there is genuine engagement throughout with ideas that are sketched at its outset. It also makes the collection somewhat narrower than it might have been.

I will address the book's ten chapters in turn. To keep this review concise, I employ the following criteria. First, I focus on chapters that genuinely address ignorance. Second, I draw attention to ideas that call into question the goal of a purely epistemic account of ignorance. Third, I draw attention to arguments that invite us to rethink another starting-point of the volume: that epistemology as we know it has so far said little or nothing about ignorance. Fourth, I mention some contributions on ignorance that might have shaped the book's discussions, had the editors cast the net more widely.

Chapter 1, by Pierre Le Morvan and Peels, recapitulates their arguments for what they call the Standard and the New View: ignorance is lack or absence of knowledge (Standard View) or of true belief (New View) respectively. The rider "lack or absence" may seem to have been introduced as an afterthought, also in the editors' Introduction. Nothing in the discussion suggests reflection on the difference. If ignorance is a lack, it is in general a bad thing. If ignorance is absence of knowledge (or absence of true belief as Peels has it), there is room for instances of ignorance that are indifferent and others that are good. Say, if I don't know the composition of your most recent meal before you read this review, this is -- absent special circumstances -- not a lack. In the spirit of a Clutter Principle, it may even be to my advantage not to clutter my mind with trivia that are irrelevant relative to my actions and lines of inquiry.

Nikolaj Nottelmann ("The Varieties of Ignorance") distinguishes between factual ignorance, objectual ignorance, erotetic ignorance (ignorance of answers to questions), and practical ignorance (how-to ignorance). The chapter thus replicates distinctions in traditional epistemology. If one is curious to see what long-standing distinctions generate if transposed to ignorance, this method is plausible. And yet it may confirm an objection against the very idea of studying ignorance. Such a project can appear futile, or at any rate not of independent interest. For it may seem that whatever one wants to know about ignorance can simply be inferred from insights about knowledge. For the study of ignorance to be compelling, however, it would need to promise insights that cannot be gained via the study of knowledge. I take it that this line of thought is the most basic and most widespread objection against the emerging field that the volume aims to help get off the ground.

What, then, could have been said about the varieties of ignorance if one did not start exclusively from staple distinctions in epistemology? Here is one suggestion, inspired by basic questions in metaphysics and ethics. Nottelmann begins by stating that ignorance, like knowledge, is factive. For example, not knowing that Santa Claus exists is not a case of ignorance (34). Why not? Because Santa Claus does not exist. So far so good, though there will be any number of tricky cases. For example, what about ignorance and vagueness (Timothy Williamson 1992, Cian Dorr 2003)? What about ignorance of our position in space, which Shamik Dasgupta calls inexpressible (2015)? Most perspicuously, Nottelmann's factual ignorance seems to capture only facts of a certain sort, perhaps to be called descriptive. Deliberative ignorance -- ignorance of what to do -- and normative ignorance more broadly speaking seem to fall outside of the spectrum Nottelmann considers. Of course, it is controversial whether there are normative facts. Normative ignorance might count as distinctively practical. But practical ignorance, as Nottelmann understands this notion, is how-to ignorance. As a result, Nottelmann's varieties of ignorance fail to accommodate some of the most familiar kinds of ignorance: being ignorant of what should be done, what is better/worse, right/wrong, and so on.

Another limitation of a purely epistemic approach may be that, in a field that is perceived as entering unmapped territory, philosophy of language may offer useful guidance. In this spirit, Berit Brogaard's "Ignorance and Incompetence" is one of the most successful chapters. Brogaard starts from Peter Unger's observation that "is ignorant" does not combine with "that" clauses; it goes with the clause "of the fact that . . ." The complement of "is ignorant," she argues, is not "knows that . . ."; it is "is knowledgeable of the fact that . . ." To illustrate, Brogaard uses the familiar example of knowing who was at a given party. On her account someone is ignorant or knowledgeable of, say, the fact that Mary was at the party. And yet, one may ask whether Brogaard merely exchanges one awkward use of language for another. She seems right to note that we would not say "A is ignorant that Mary was at the party." But this does not make it natural to say "A is knowledgeable of the fact that Mary was at the party." If we have reason to stick to colloquial locutions, it would seem that "is ignorant of the fact that . . ." is the complement of "knows that . . ." even though, to use Brogaard's formulation, these locutions are not grammatically on par (71).

And yet Brogaard advances a novel proposal about ignorance. Beyond the level of grammar, Unger's observation may indicate that "is ignorant" is not often used with respect to one proposition or one fact. Mere not-knowing of particulars, such as who was at the party, is often just expressed in terms of not knowing. "Was Mary there?" -- "don't know!" The reply "I'm ignorant of . . ." seems out of place. In ordinary ignorance-ascriptions, we often refer to questions or domains. Someone is ignorant about fashion, in biology, of the history of slavery, with respect to all things digital, and so on. Once this is made explicit, Brogaard's proposal that "is knowledgeable" is the complement of "is ignorant" gains import. When we say that someone is knowledgeable we rarely refer to one particular proposition or fact. We say that someone is knowledgeable about fashion, in biology, of the history of slavery, with respect to all things digital, and so on. That is, pushed further Brogaard's proposal may lead toward a contrast between ignorance and being knowledgeable, both of which are characteristically concerned with sets of questions and domains.

"Explicating Ignorance and Doubt" by Erik J. Olsson and Carlo Proietti offers a possible worlds analysis of doubt and ignorance. Presumably, ignorance has been on the radar of epistemology via the specter of skepticism. Skepticism, throughout the volume, is understood as external world skepticism of Cartesian provenance. This tradition stipulates that a subject believes that p, comes to doubt that p, and if trust is restored knows that p. Ignorance here is of a specific kind: it is ignorance brought about by doubting what was antecedently believed. In their analysis of ignorance and doubt, Olsson and Proietti presuppose this type of framework. Their cognizers don't know whether propositions that might be believed are true, and doubt these propositions. Among other things, this means that complete ignorance is not captured. An agent who is ignorant, say, of dinosaurs because she has never even heard of dinosaurs, does not count as ignorant on the authors' definition (cf. Haas and Vogt 2015). Similarly, genuinely open interrogative attitudes -- attitudes that do not relate to a set of potential answers -- are not captured (cf. Jane Friedman 2014).

Olsson and Proietti take it that doubt motivates inquiry (81), and that ignorance is "obviously the endpoint of many skeptical inquiries" (82). If we set Cartesian skepticism aside, however, the picture may look different. Suppose that in science and philosophy we want to figure out how things are. This motivates inquiry. We think through theories and models, test them via experiments and arguments, refine them, and so on. The outcome of inquiry is typically more inquiry: the next research question. This is how ancient skepticism conceives of investigation. Given how recognizable this is, one wonders why the Cartesian framework should inform ignorance studies in the first place. Taking one's cue from ancient skepticism, interrogative and hypothetical states of mind are natural topics, and so is caring about a given question, a feature of inquiry that Olsson and Proietti draw attention to. In a way that is characteristic of their carefully argued paper, they note that this is a non-epistemic dimension of their analysis. There are too many things any given cognizer is ignorant of for interrogative attitudes to arise with respect to all of them. Insofar as ignorance relates to doubt and to investigation, it needs to combine with affective states of caring and being interested.

Chapters 5 and 6 suggest that it may not have been easy to persuade sufficiently many epistemologists to write on ignorance. "Ignorance and Epistemic Contextualism" by Michael Blome-Tillmann is a first-rate introduction to epistemic contextualism about knowledge. In "Anti-Intellectualism and Ignorance," Jessica Brown defends anti-intellectualism about knowledge gained via testimony and memory. Both papers are interesting in their own right. And yet they are mostly about knowledge.

"Ignorance and Epistemic Value" by Duncan Pritchard asks whether ignorance can have epistemic value. It is among the most interesting chapters. Pritchard aims to get clear about a question that is inherently about ignorance. Proposals are formulated in cautious terms, to the extent that the paper reads as an invitation to further work. Pritchard distinguishes between epistemic, practical, and intrinsic value. He takes it to be uncontroversial that ignorance can have practical value. In his example, it can be of practical value not to know that one was adopted. And yet "practical" may have at least two dimensions: it could refer, as Pritchard has it, to the agent's happiness or it could refer to practical reasoning and deliberation. Ignorance of being adopted may be practically valuable insofar as knowledge of being adopted, according to Pritchard, could reduce the agent's happiness. This is compatible with ignorance of being adopted having disvalue in deliberation. In some contexts the agent may miss a crucial premise -- the information that she is adopted -- that could inform her decision-making. What is more, the notion of happiness Pritchard employs is a technical notion in use among philosophers and psychologists, referencing something like "feeling well." But knowledge of key facts about oneself, even if at times unpleasant, may well aid an agent in leading a good life. And the agent's happiness may ultimately involve that her life is, on the whole and on consideration, good. Accordingly, the question of when ignorance is practically valuable may be more complicated than Pritchard suggests.

Pritchard argues that ignorance can also have epistemic value. Assuming that some truths are weightier than others, we may rationally prefer the acquisition of some truths over the acquisition of others. If this means preferring one set of doxastic attitudes over another set, it may involve that one prefers some bits of ignorance over others. This is one way, Pritchard suggests, in which ignorance may have epistemic value. On Pritchard's account it appears that practical and epistemic value are straightforwardly disjunct. And yet some familiar ways in which ignorance has epistemic value have practical dimensions. For example, in double-blind studies in medicine ignorance seems to have epistemic value. It is conducive to truth-finding. Similarly, blinding in legal reasoning and political philosophy -- say, Rawls's veil of ignorance -- aims at ignorance that is conducive to inquiry. In both cases, ignorance is not intrinsically valuable: the pieces of information that are removed are by themselves valuable (cf. Haas and Vogt 2015). The value of ignorance, here, may seem to be epistemic insofar as ignorance supports discovery and practical insofar as ignorance is chosen with a view to curing patients, fair law-giving, and so on.

"Ignorance and the Religious Life" by Justin McBrayer offers a helpful conspectus of ways in which ignorance figures in theological traditions. It serves as a reminder that ignorance used to be a household topic in epistemology. After all, any number of theology-driven philosophers thought we are in ignorance of the presumed highest object of knowledge: God. The volume's starting-point, that epistemologists are not interested in ignorance, may turn out to capture a given moment rather than a long-standing trend.

A similar thought applies to Miranda Fricker's "Epistemic Injustice and the Preservation of Ignorance" and José Medina's "Ignorance and Racial Insensitivity." Fricker and Medina summarize some of their previously published work and relate it to recent arguments. Both chapters are helpful introductions to lively debates at the intersection of political philosophy and epistemology. Fricker responds, for example, to arguments advanced by Charles Mills and situates her work vis-à-vis his notion of "white ignorance." Both chapters recall some of the earliest relevant discussions in the Western tradition. In Plato's dialogues, ignorance is portrayed as a pernicious feature of the powerful and a pervasive condition, supported by customary education and social structures. Insofar as we draw on the history of epistemology, then, it may not come as a surprise that the study of ignorance is intertwined with normative questions (cf. Vogt 2012, chapter 1). With a view to political realities philosophers might be well served to acknowledge a strand in the tradition that isn't altogether optimistic. Epistemologists tend to love the first line of Aristotle's Metaphysics: "all human beings by nature desire to know." To this Plato says, "I wish!" Medina revives relevant questions about the affective attitudes of ignorance. If epistemic states have affective dimensions, as Medina argues, this supplies further reason for situating the study of ignorance at the intersection of epistemology and normative fields in philosophy.

What then about potential buyers who judge this book on ignorance by its cover? They see, alas, not a bearded sage (this would be a book on knowledge, naturally), but a caricature of an ill-informed woman, namely a maiden in distress, clad in a pink, fluffy frock, eyes covered with a blindfold. She gets it all wrong, trying to row a boat on land, with mere sticks as rudders. One may remind oneself of an observation from Fricker's and Medina's essays: stereotypes are not the fault of any one individual. Hence it may be best to think about this in general terms. The proposal that one must care about some issue in order to aim to get things right comes to mind. And one may return to the analysis of how-to ignorance: what is involved in the ability to read an image, if doing so requires some mix of sense perception, aesthetic perception, and perception of morally salient features? Either way, your stunned reviewer left her review sample on her office table for a week or two, soliciting impressions from students, colleagues, and other visitors. If you buy this book, it may be advisable to not leave it on your desk except face down.


Shamik Dasgupta, "Inexpressible Ignorance," Philosophical Review 124 (2015): 441-480.

Cian Dorr, "Vagueness Without Ignorance," Philosophical Perspectives 17 (2003): 83-113.

Jane Friedman, "Question-Directed Attitudes," Philosophical Perspectives 27 (2013): 145-174.

Jens Haas and Katja Maria Vogt, "Ignorance and Investigation," in Routledge International Handbook on Ignorance, eds. Matthias Gross and Linsey McGoey (Routledge, 2015): 17-25.

Katja Maria Vogt, "What is Ignorance?" chapter 1 in Belief and Truth (Oxford University Press, 2012): 25-50.

Timothy Williamson, "Vagueness and Ignorance," Proceedings of the Aristotelian Society Suppl. Vols. 66 (1992): 145-162.