The Epistemic Lightness of Truth: Deflationism and its Logic

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Cezary Cieśliński, The Epistemic Lightness of Truth: Deflationism and its Logic, Cambridge University Press, 2017, 298 pp., $99.00, ISBN 9781107197657.

Reviewed by Leon Horsten, University of Bristol


Deflationist views about truth hold that truth is somehow a metaphysically light and insubstantial notion -- unlike the concept of set, for instance. Many philosophers and philosophical logicians today believe that truth theoretic deflationism is on the right track. But the devil is in the details. The aim of deflationism is to articulate a theory of truth that accurately and in a detailed way describes the logical behaviour of the concept of truth and that also captures a deep sense in which truth is a metaphysically light notion. In fact, it seems to me that deflationists about truth need not claim that the deflationist conception of truth is the only viable one. They could agree with [Field 1994] that beside the concept of deflationary truth there is also a more substantial concept of truth -- one might call this the scientific concept of truth -- that is worth investigating logically and philosophically.

Cieśliński aims to contribute to the deflationist programme. He subjects a variety of formal truth theories to logico-philosophical scrutiny. For each theory that is reviewed in this way, he investigates both what its logical properties are and whether it can be said to properly capture the right deflationist perspective. Throughout the book, logical and philosophical considerations are closely intertwined.

As is fairly common in the literature on truth theoretic deflationism, from a logical perspective, Cieśliński focuses on axiomatic truth theories. Within this class, he is interested mostly in theories of typed truth, and he discusses only theories formulated in classical logic. A background theory of syntax of course always needs to be adopted. As is standard in the field, Cieśliński mostly adopts Peano Arithmetic (PA) as the background theory of syntax.

Given his deflationist perspective, it is only natural that the author is primarily interested in proof theoretically modest truth theories. Indeed, it is telling that Cieśliński takes the type-free compositional theory (CT) to be a strong truth theory (p. 186). All this is not to say that model theoretic considerations are of little consequence in the book. On the contrary: one of the strengths of this monograph is that deep model theoretic techniques and concepts (such as recursive saturation and satisfaction classes) are brought to bear on the axiomatic investigation of truth.

The book consists of three parts. Part I (three chapters) discusses disquotational truth theories. Part II (five chapters) is about compositional truth theories. Part III (two chapters) investigates the relation between deflationist truth and proof theoretic reflection principles. At the end of each chapter, a very helpful concise summary is given of the chapter's main logical and philosophical outcomes.

It is natural to conjecture that a formalisation of truth theoretic deflationism should be given by a collection of Tarski-biconditionals. However, Tarski already showed that the full compositional behaviour of truth cannot be derived from a disquotational basis alone. The failure of disquotational theories to entail general compositional principles such as

(*)       Ɐφ∈LPA[T(←φ)↔←T(φ)]

has come to be known as the generalisation problem for deflationism (chapter 5).

The elementary compositional principles such as (*), taken together, form (in the context of PA with induction for the extended language) a natural axiomatic truth theory, called CT. Halbach and other philosophical logicians have in recent decades argued that variants and type-free analogues of CT have many virtues as truth theories. But at the same time, it has been hotly debated whether a deflationist is entitled to adopt them. In this philosophical debate, the notion of conservativeness plays a central role (chapter 9, chapter 11).

The problem is this. On the one hand, it is tempting to say that only conservative axiomatic truth theories deserve the label 'deflationist'. On the other hand, there are natural and widely accepted informal argumentation patterns that lead one from a background theory (PA), using truth theoretic reasoning (such as is sanctioned by CT), to proof theoretic reflection principles such as Con(PA) and the global reflection principle


which are independent of the background theory PA. In sum, it appears that truth is not conservative.

Cieśliński does not accept semantic conservativeness as a precondition for an axiomatic truth theory being deflationist (section 9.1). But he looks more favourably on adopting syntactic conservativeness (aka proof theoretic conservativeness) as a constraint on deflationist truth theories (section 9.2). In view of this, Cieśliński displays a cautious preference for syntactically conservative compositional truth theories such as, for instance, the theory CT-, which is obtained from CT by restricting induction to formulas in which the truth predicate does not occur.

The main anti-deflationist arguments in the literature assert that proof theoretic reflection principles can be justified using truth theoretic principles (see for instance [Ketland 1999]). In an interesting move, Cieśliński takes steps in the opposite direction. In chapter 12, he shows how, against the background of a weak disquotational theory, stronger truth principles (such as induction for the extended language, and compositional truth principles such as (*)) can be derived from proof theoretic reflection principles. The upshot of this is roughly that, modulo a weak disquotational background theory, proof theoretic reflection principles can be taken to be equivalent to truth theoretic principles. This constitutes an important new truth theoretic insight.

Cieśliński believes that we typically can come to know, in other ways than by adopting new basic mathematical axioms, proof theoretic reflection principles for mathematical theories that we already accept. However, given his deflationist commitments, he holds that this knowledge cannot come from a basic acceptance of a 'strong' truth theory such as CT. How, then, do we arrive from a modest, conservative truth theory as a starting point, to reflection principles for it (or, 'equivalently', to accepting a nonconservative truth theory)?

At this point, Cieśliński takes a cue from Feferman's doctrine of commitments that are implicit in accepting a theory [Feferman 1962]. He agrees with Feferman that by reflecting on our implicit commitments, we can come to accept reflection principles for a theory that we already accept. In this way, Cieśliński brings truth theory in contact with themes that are of major significance in the foundations of mathematics.

I believe that the epistemic process of reflection that is involved here is presently still ill-understood. (The best philosophical work on this subject, prior to Cieśliński's book, is [Franzen 2004].) Proof theorists have since the 1960s concentrated mostly on analysing the output of the process of (iterated) reflection. But a good philosophical analysis of the process of reflection itself has hitherto been lacking.

In part III, Cieśliński takes first steps towards filling this gap. Central in his theory of implicit commitment is the notion of believability. The thought is that when a person reflects on the implicit commitments involved in her acceptance of a theory K, she comes to accept a theory of believability Bel(K) over K. Cieśliński explains how this process is structured, and he spells out Bel(K) as an axiomatic theory (p. 254). For instance, Bel(K) contains the principle

Ɐφ∈L[BewK(φ) → B(φ)],

where B is the believability predicate and L is the extended language containing the truth predicate and the believability predicate. It is then shown that if K is some conservative disquotational truth theory, Bel(K) proves the believability of compositional truth laws and of reflection principles for K. From the believability of compositionality of truth and of reflection, the agent then is entitled to infer to compositionality of truth and to reflection simpliciter, provided that there are no overriding reasons against doing so (section 13.5).

I cannot praise this book too highly. I predict that it will constitute indispensable reading for any researcher in the field (professional or postgraduate) for years to come. Many open problems are listed: many of them would constitute excellent subjects of a PhD dissertation in philosophical logic; others set a research agenda that will keep a significant part of the next generation of researchers on axiomatic truth occupied.

The book is a cross between a research monograph and a postgraduate textbook. In a sentence, it can be described as the book one needs to read next after reading Volker Halbach's Axiomatic Theories of Truth [Halbach 2015]. It picks up where Halbach's book leaves off; it contains a superb treatment of recent developments in the field, and leads the reader into subjects and problems that are likely to dominate research in the field in the next decade. Two features deserve to be highlighted. First, the book contains a superior discussion of recent proof-theoretic work on 'weak' axiomatic theories of truth. The interest in these theories has been growing rapidly over the last decade -- the Warsaw school has been instrumental in this development -- and our knowledge about such theories has greatly increased. Cieśliński gives an outstanding exposition of the results in this area: the proofs of the results are beautiful, clear, and well-structured. But he also explains the importance of these results for truth theoretic deflationism. Secondly, Cieśliński introduces the reader to the relation between axiomatic truth theory and proof theoretic reflection principles. This, too, is in my view an area that will expand rapidly over the coming years, and for good reasons.

Cieśliński is in general cautious in the philosophical claims that he makes. Nevertheless, there are a couple of points where I am not completely persuaded by his arguments.

First, in his discussion of deflationism in chapter 9, Cieśliński takes a different stance to syntactic conservativity than to semantic conservativity. Even though he does not believe that it can be convincingly argued that syntactic conservativity of truth theories is implicit in traditional forms of truth theoretic deflationism that can be found in the literature, he asserts that ''none of what has been said here entails that syntactic conservativity cannot function as a new explication of the lightness of truth, proposed with full awareness that its connection with the tradition is loose'' (p. 170; see also p. 173). Concerning semantic conservativity, Cieśliński's judgement is harsher (p. 154):

I have failed to find good arguments for the semantic conservativity demand. Moreover, it seems to me that attempts to explain why semantic conservativity should matter are at odds with some basic tenets by adherents of the 'lightness of truth' doctrine . . .

I will now argue that Cieśliński does not quite give semantic conservativity a run for its money.

The basic difficulty that Cieśliński sees with requiring semantic conservativity is that ''arguments for semantic conservativity seem to take the notion of intended model for granted'' (pp. 172-173). Appeal to an intended model is (rightly) taken by Cieśliński to be against the spirit of deflationism (p. 147).

But it seems to me that one of the arguments in favour of the semantic conservativity requirement that Cieśliński discusses looks rather promising. Playing the devil's advocate, he gives the following argument on behalf of semantic conservativity (p. 151):

There is a final move which should be considered. It involves declaring from the start that the very notion of intended model is incomprehensible and that all models are on an equal par . . . all models matter.

Cieśliński argues against this view in the following way. Taking PA as a background theory, a semantically conservative truth theory over PA considers Con(PA), for instance, no more acceptable than its negation. But models making Con(PA) true are simply wrong, so not all models are on a par (p. 152). In response to this, one might see ←Con(PA) as just one more arithmetical statement, true in some models, false in others. But Cieśliński resists this line of reasoning, saying (p. 153):

I am ready to assume that we have access to the domain of syntactic objects of our language -- to our `real-life' formulas, sentences, terms, proofs, and so on. When describing syntactic properties of these objects, we discover that it is possible . . . to describe them as numbers . . . With this approach, the sentence Con(PA) can be said to 'express' the consistency of Peano arithmetic . . . because of the way it is built, in a close parallel with a natural consistency statement.

The problem with this line of reasoning, in my view, is that it is tantamount to appealing to the notion of intended model, which was to be avoided at all cost. If some proofs were of non-standard length -- and who is to say that they are not? -- then how do we know that some of them could not be proofs of the inconsistency of Peano arithmetic?

To demand semantic conservativity would seem to be in harmony with some of the other claims that Cieśliński makes. For instance, he holds that ''the notion of truth is to be characterised by means of simple axioms . . . which play the role of meaning postulates'' (p. 146; see also p. 22). If one is claiming of a notion that it has certain properties by semantic convention, then it seems that adding the appropriate meaning postulates to the background theory should be a semantically conservative extension of the background theory. Moreover, accepting semantic conservativeness as a constraint on truth theories would not significantly affect the overall structure of Cieśliński's argument. It is true that semantic conservativeness rules out pretty much all truth theories with full induction for the extended language, and even many compositional theories with induction only for arithmetical formulas, such as CT-, for instance (p. 149). There may therefore be pragmatic reasons for not imposing semantic conservativity as a constraint on truth theories. But Cieśliński's main theorems concerning believability extensions Bel(K) (such as theorem 13.4.17 and theorem 13.4.18) concern background theories K that are semantically conservative.

The second point concerns Cieśliński's theory of implicit commitment in Part III. Briefly, I am not convinced that the process of reflection involves explicitly accepting the theory of believability over that background theory that Cieśliński proposes. More work needs to be done to motivate that this is what happens in reflection. An alternative account that does not involve explicit acceptance of laws concerning believability is given in [Horsten and Leigh 2017]. But this account suffers from the same weakness. What is still lacking, and what the subject sorely needs, is a careful phenomenological analysis of the process of reflecting on one's implicit commitments.


Feferman, S. Transfinite recursive progressions of formal theories. Journal of Symbolic Logic 27(1962), pp. 259-316.

Field, H. Deflationist views of meaning and content. Mind 103(1994), pp. 249-285.

Franzen, T. Inexhaustibility. A non-exhaustive treatment. A.K. Peters, 2004.

Halbach, V. Axiomatic Theories of Truth. Second Edition. Cambridge University Press, 2015.

Horsten, L. and Leigh, G. Truth is simple. Mind 216(2017), pp. 195-232.

Ketland, J. Deflationism and Tarski's paradise. Mind 108(1999), pp. 69-94.