The Epistemology of Disagreement: New Essays

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David Christensen and Jennifer Lackey (eds.), The Epistemology of Disagreement: New Essays, Oxford University Press, 2013, 272pp., $65.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780199698370.

Reviewed by Nathan Ballantyne, Fordham University


This volume is a collection of eleven papers, assembled and briefly introduced by David Christensen and Jennifer Lackey. At the heart of the collection, we find issues that appear at once theoretically fascinating and practically weighty. This joining-together of theoretical appeal and real-life significance in recent debates about disagreement may help to explain the explosion of recent work on "the epistemology of disagreement." (By my non-scientific tally, over the last ten or so years, nearly three hundred papers focusing on that topic have been published -- not to mention scores of Ph.D. dissertations and Master's theses.) Have epistemological debates been reinvigorated by discussions of disagreement? Maybe, maybe not. But, in my view, this book advances our previous understanding of the topic and draws attention to new issues for exploration. It is essential reading for anyone interested in epistemological and meta-philosophical topics.

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Before I say more about the collection, allow me to introduce you to Sophia, a philosopher by trade and a friend of mine. Sophia -- whose name has been changed to protect her privacy -- used to believe that research on epistemology was boring. While a graduate student, she took a couple of epistemology seminars and had the feeling that questions about external world skepticism, the structure of epistemic justification, and the "Gettier" problem didn't have much to do with anything she -- or reasonable humans more generally -- should care about. "It seemed to me," Sophia wrote to me in an email, "epistemologists had stoked the coal fires of the express train to boredom and irrelevance." The trouble wasn't that Sophia didn't understand epistemologists' questions, or that she didn't follow the answers they proposed. Not at all -- Sophia's mind is perceptive and patient. It wasn't that she doubted epistemology could be valuable for human beings -- she admired classic historical episodes of epistemic investigation from Descartes and Locke and ancient skeptics. But Sophia thought that contemporary epistemologists, for all of their cleverness, were engaged in an uninteresting and futile enterprise -- "like accountants taking inventory of the sand on the seashore," she said. I understood her sentiment. Philosophers working today all know that others in academic philosophy regard our research topics as tedious and of doubtful value (cf. Dennett (2006), Kitcher (2011), and Unger (2014)).

But then Sophia changed her mind. I sent her an essay on disagreement by an epistemologist (see Richard Feldman's 2007 essay in Philosophers without Gods: Meditations on Atheism and the Secular Life, ed. Louise Antony, Oxford University Press). Sophia was gripped. The essay suggested a brand of epistemology that would offer her useful intellectual advice. She tells me she'll assign that essay the next time she teaches Intro. And she surprised herself by wanting to read more deeply in contemporary epistemology.

Disagreement is an occupational hazard for philosophers and so it's no surprise that the present volume shows us the fault lines of disagreements about disagreement. Here's one particular divide to keep in mind. On the one side, some of the chapters illustrate a way of approaching epistemic theorizing with the goal of imparting advice. On the other, some contributions express doubts whether theories of disagreement can give useful advice. This threatens to undermine Sophia's newfound idea that contemporary epistemology is worthwhile after all. And so one possibility here, one I'll try to underline, is that discussions of disagreement may be a kind of philosophical bait-and-switch. If so, Sophia and others were led to believe that epistemology would give them something of real value -- epistemic advice -- but in the end they just got more boring theory.

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Recent work on disagreement has largely fixated on epistemic peer disagreement. More than half of the papers in this volume enter that debate, in one way or another, so it's worth going over the set-up of the standard problem.

Plausibly, we often disagree with so-called epistemic peers -- thinkers who are just as well-informed and well-disposed to rationally react to the evidence as we are. But once we recognize that a peer rejects our belief, how can we rationally maintain our original confidence in our view? Don't we now have at least some reason to change our minds? The standard debate is over whether and how much belief-revision is rationally mandated by recognizing that peers disagree. Conciliationists argue we should always reduce confidence in our belief. If conciliationists are correct, and it turns out that recognized peer disagreements are widespread, we will be led to widespread belief-revision. There is a spectrum of conciliationist views, ranging from ones that require considerable revision to those that require only a bit. Non-conciliationists argue it's rational in some recognized peer disagreements for at least one peer to hold her ground, though non-conciliationists may say that many such disagreements require belief-revision.

In this volume we find recent rounds of exchange between conciliationists and non-conciliationists. For instance, Stewart Cohen's chapter defends a version of a strong conciliationist position -- the "Equal Weight View" -- according to which a thinker should give just as much weight to the opinion of a disagreeing peer as her own. This sort of theory appears ready to guide us. Its advice, put in terms of credences, is that recognized peer disagreement mandates "splitting the difference" between our own credence and our peer's; in terms of all-or-nothing belief, it advises us to suspend judgment. Cohen's defence of a version of the Equal Weight View responds to an important challenge from earlier work by Thomas Kelly (see (2010)). Kelly charged that the Equal Weight View sometimes leads us to fail to take account of evidence. Kelly had in mind cases involving asymmetries between disagreeing peers: when one peer is correct ("Correct Peer", we may call her) and the other is not, it seems implausible that both must make equally extensive revisions to their original opinions, as the Equal Weight View implies they should. Kelly's idea is that the existence of an asymmetry permits Correct Peer not to conciliate, and so the Equal Weight View is false. Cohen argues that Kelly's argument assumes Correct Peer should revise on considerations that cannot be inferred from her evidence, but also that revisions to one's credence depend only on what is supported by one's evidence. But this, Cohen observes, is incoherent. His crisp discussion also explores the relation between the Equal Weight View and some principles concerning the range of attitudes it's rational to hold on the basis of a single body of evidence (so-called uniqueness principles).

The chapters by Brian Weatherson and David Christensen explore an important objection to conciliationism. In view of recognized controversy among peers concerning the correctness of conciliationist principles, do those principles mandate their own rejection and, if so, doesn't that mean the principles are incoherent? This objection looks obvious at first sight but leads to hard questions.

Weatherson's contribution brings to acid-free paper a blog post from 2007 along with "afterthoughts" from 2011. There's much of interest in this chapter. Briefly, Weatherson argues that the Equal Weight View's best response to worries about self-undermining faces a fatal regress argument, and so we should reject the Equal Weight View (see section 6). Christensen's discussion of the self-undermining objection grants that sometimes conciliationists' principles mandate their own rejection, and then tries to resist the conclusion that this amounts to reason to reject conciliationism. Christensen scrutinizes some recent discussions of the objection, but a key idea in his own response is that self-undermining is just what we get when rational ideals conflict. Indeed, he thinks the possibility of conflicting ideals is part and parcel of theorizing about what is rational for fallible thinkers. Christensen sees self-undermining arguments as capitalizing on the possibility of situations where, "no matter what one ends up believing" (p. 91), one must violate a rational ideal.

Here's a simple example. A thinker can accept the correct fundamental epistemic rule and yet come to have doubts about that rule -- after learning that she may have taken judgment-distorting drugs, say. One ideal is to accept the correct fundamental rule; another is to respect "higher-order" evidence of potential error in accepting the rule. Sometimes, a thinker can't do both. Such dilemmas are no reason to think any of the conflicting ideals are false, argues Christensen; this is only what may befuddle imperfect thinkers. Importantly, he motivates his conflicting-ideals view independently of self-undermining objections to conciliationism; it is an attractive view because it preserves a connection between higher-order evidence of potential error and what's first-order rational for us to think. Christensen's rich discussion should be the starting point for future work on the self-undermining of epistemic principles.

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For those who doubt whether (recognized) epistemic peers are common enough to raise a challenge for many of our controversial beliefs, chapters from Sanford Goldberg and Bryan Frances may offer a welcome approach. Both Goldberg and Frances are concerned with belief-revision in light of specifically philosophical disagreement. Frances's paper identifies epistemic trouble for our age of philosophical (hyper)specialization. Philosophers these days often hold opinions on many controversial philosophical topics outside their areas of research specialty, Frances notes, and surely that is right (see Bourget & Chalmers, forthcoming). The "epistemic renegade" is a non-expert on some topic who recognizes that epistemic superiors disagree but keeps her belief nonetheless. Frances aims to understand when the epistemic renegade has done something "seriously epistemically defective" by retaining her belief. One possibility is that the renegade is always an epistemic bungler, but Frances argues that renegades have a way out when their belief concerns a matter of common sense -- say, when a non-expert believes that she has hands while knowing about philosophical experts who claim there are no composite objects. Nevertheless, Frances's highly-articulated argument recommends a fairly radical sort of skepticism for renegades who believe "purely philosophical" claims that don't concern common sense, unless wide swaths of philosophy are bunk. His discussion also includes stimulating observations about the place of common sense in philosophical theorizing (see esp. section 11).

Goldberg is concerned with what he calls "systematic" disagreements. Put roughly, a systematic disagreement over a proposition p is persistent, related to issues beyond p, and involves well-entrenched positions on each side (see pp. 169-70). Such disagreements needn't be peer disagreements, though they may be. Goldberg's discussion has three parts. First, he contends that the best explanation of systematic disagreement is one that calls into question the reliability of each side. Goldberg gives philosophers much to chew on. (An aside: Ernest Sosa's contribution to the volume briefly suggests that verbal disputes may be relatively commonplace among philosophers (see p. 199). But, as Goldberg recognizes (see p. 176 fn. 22), since philosophers talking past each other may each be reliable, if verbal disputes are common, then the best explanation for systematic disagreement may not be unreliability.)

Second, Goldberg argues that if we're party to a systematic disagreement and can't rule out that we are the unreliable ones -- even if we are reliable -- then our belief is unjustified, even if non-conciliationist theories hold true. Finally, having argued that philosophers' unreliability best explains their systematic disagreement and this explanation defeats their justification, Goldberg turns to implications for philosophers' discourse. Can they properly assert their views? Advocates of some popular norms of assertion will think not: if systematically controversial beliefs are unjustified, philosophers' assertions are epistemically defective, too. Some among us may embrace that implication for philosophical practice, counseling philosophers to remain silent. (Here I have in mind philosophers' friends and families.) But, according to Goldberg, an unjustified belief that p may stand behind a proper assertion that p. In certain conversations, he says, where it's assumed by philosophers that "knowledge and other epistemically high-grade information is hard to come by" (p. 188), an assertion that expresses an unjustified belief may be appropriate. Goldberg thus advocates strong skepticism about controversial philosophical issues but denies that his skepticism should lead philosophers to put a sock in it.

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Most of the chapters explore theories that would bestow good advice for reacting to recognized disagreement of various kinds. But, as I have noted, the idea that theories of disagreement help us doesn't go unchallenged. This raises the possibility of a kind of bait-and-switch. Could it be that discussions of disagreement have lured us into the shop with promises of epistemic advice only to sell us theories that don't help us sort out our intellectual lives? The chapter by John Hawthorne and Amia Srinivasan and that by Thomas Kelly suggest that's basically what has happened.

According to Hawthorne and Srinivasan, epistemologists seek a principled, general, and intuitively-satisfying answer to the following question: what ought one to do, epistemically speaking, when faced with a disagreement? Hawthorne and Srinivasan argue against the project of formulating epistemic norms. Their idea is not that theorists have so far failed to supply plausible norms. As they see it, the project is doomed from the start. Their argument is bold and, at turns, demanding of the reader. It hinges upon the truth of what they call "non-transparency": the idea that there is no condition such that we're always able to know whether it obtains. But they contend that a satisfying norm must deploy an 'ought' that is tied to transparent conditions, and that's ruled out by non-transparency. The argument raises "a general problem for the ambition to formulate all sorts of epistemic norms" (p. 30).

Kelly likewise offers doubts about the epistemology of disagreement as an advice-generating enterprise. His main concern is to defend a non-conciliationist view of disagreement. On Kelly's Total Evidence View, all of the facts about a thinker's evidence need to be accounted for when determining how to react to a disagreement, but sometimes those facts can make it reasonable for a thinker to stick with her view even in light of recognized peer disagreement (p. 35). Kelly criticizes conciliationists who have invoked "Independence" principles -- which roughly say that our evaluation of a disagreeing peer's belief, when deciding whether and how to modify our own belief, should not depend on the reasoning behind our belief. Kelly thinks that if we accept Independence, conciliationism is "more or less irresistible" (p. 37), but he alleges that there are counterexamples to Independence principles and those principles are otherwise unmotivated (see sections 3 and 4).

Kelly's discussion of Independence places in high-res focus cases of reasoning where someone rejects another thinker's belief on the basis of the grounds for her own belief. Defenders of Independence may view the reasoning as dogmatic. But Kelly presses the question of whether or not we can determine that some reasoning is dogmatic as a purely "formal" matter, that is, without appealing to substantive judgments about what is reasonable. (To clarify his use of "formal", Kelly notes that hypocrisy is a formal vice because we can determine whether someone's a hypocrite without judgments about the correct moral standards.) Dogmatism, thinks Kelly, is not a formal vice: to determine whether reasoning is dogmatic, we have to appeal to judgments about what's reasonable. And so there will be no straightforward norm to determine whether some reasoning is dogmatic.

Kelly uses this to line up a shot at conciliationism. The conciliationists' proposed norms are supposed to give advice about belief-revision. Kelly proposes that "how one is rationally required to respond to a disagreement is not typically something that is fixed independently of substantive normative facts about how well-supported one's original view is" (p. 51). It would be convenient to have in hand conciliationists' norms to guide our reaction to disagreement. But all we have to go on in "hard cases", Kelly says, is our judgment about what's reasonable. We must live with "the burdens of judgment" -- without easy-to-follow norms. In other words, Kelly has doubts about the venture of giving epistemic advice, in the form of general norms, for reacting to difficult, real-world disagreements. His Total Evidence View doesn't only break from conciliationism in treating some cases of recognized peer disagreement as rational. His view appears to reject the aspiration of formulating norms for cognitive regulation in non-ideal disagreements.

We should not forget Sophia in all of this. She welcomed the idea of epistemology as an advice-giving practice. But if Hawthorne and Srinivasan and Kelly are correct, it's not clear whether epistemologists offer what Sophia wants. As I see things, this disagreement between conciliationists and some of their critics -- a dispute over the scope and possibility of the epistemology of disagreement as an advice-giving enterprise -- must continue to feature in ongoing debates.

It seemed to me that Sophia was pleased, perhaps even a little encouraged, by her discovery that epistemology could help her conduct her intellectual life. She felt it could offer both instruction and delight. A similar feeling drew me to the topic as well, and I lament the possibility that theorizing about disagreement doesn't, in the end, tell us the first thing to do when we actually find ourselves in one. What we need to better understand, I think, are the regulative and normative aspirations of epistemology. Here are a few questions. If general norms can guide us in non-ideal cases, what must be true? Must Hawthorne and Srinivasan's non-transparency fail? And if we toil under the "burdens of judgment", as Kelly says, is there nothing more to say about hard cases? How may we exercise good judgment when faced with disagreement? If general norms are out of reach, could there be other varieties of epistemic guidance for epistemologists to impart? If epistemologists should not give counsel concerning hard cases, have they anything to console the likes of Sophia?

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Although I regrettably can't comment in detail on the other chapters, here are a few words on each. Robert Audi's characteristically subtle discussion explores a broad notion of cognitive disparity, which includes familiar doxastic conflict between believers and disbelievers, as well as a range of other interesting phenomena. In a chapter jam-packed with neat epistemological ideas, Jonathan Kvanvig begins to develop a theory of epistemic normativity that links higher-order reflection and first-order rationality and also defends non-conciliationism. Jennifer Lackey's trenchant chapter criticizes various ways to defend the idea that if a thinker revises a belief in light of a single disagreeing peer, that thinker needn't revise for the disagreement of other peers when the peers' opposing belief is not "independent." Ernest Sosa rises to the defense of "armchair" theorizing in response to an experimental-philosophy-fueled objection. That objection begins with survey results that "uncover disagreement in people's responses to thought experiments" (p. 190). As part of his response, Sosa offers an apt observation about the nature of disagreement, as I noted above: "It seems an open question how much of our ostensible philosophical disagreement is real and how much is based on an illusion of shared questions, an illusion that hides the divergence of our questions" (p. 199). Virtually all recent work in the field takes it for granted that many important controversies are genuine -- and many theories only apply to cases where a thinker actually accepts that a dispute is real. Sosa is correct: there is an open question here that calls for further attention.


For comments on a draft, I am grateful to Michael Hannon, Nathan King, Justin Tosi, Shane Wilkins, and Benjamin Wilson. Thanks also to Sophia for her advice and permission to use selections from her correspondence.


Bourget, David and David Chalmers. Forthcoming. "What do philosophers believe?" Philosophical Studies. Available on Online First. DOI: 10.1007/s11098-013-0259-7.

Dennett, Daniel. 2006. "Higher-order truths about chmess." Topoi 25: 39-41.

Kitcher, Philip. 2011. "Philosophy Inside Out." Metaphilosophy 42: 248-260.

Kelly, Thomas. 2010. "Peer Disagreement and Higher-Order Evidence" in Disagreement, eds. Richard Feldman and Ted Warfield. New York: Oxford University Press, pp. 111-174.

Unger, Peter. 2014. Empty Ideas: A Critique of Analytic Philosophy. New York: Oxford University Press.