The Epistemology of Reading and Interpretation

Epistemology Of Reading

René van Woudenberg, The Epistemology of Reading and Interpretation. Cambridge University Press 2021, 244pp., $99.99 (hbk), ISBN 9781316516799.

Reviewed by Sarah Worth, Furman University


This was a book of surprises for me. Most importantly, I was wrong about the topic of the book, which I had assumed was about reading fiction and literature (the beautiful cover may have misled me). The question about epistemology and reading, for me, has always been about the ways in which literature can, or might, or doesn’t, provide knowledge given that it holds no truth value, per se, or that it does not refer in the ways propositional claims do. But that is not what this book is about. This book is about what happens when we do the actual work of reading and what goes on in our minds when we interpret the symbols of language and the sentences of language. Given that I come to epistemology primarily from the literary and aesthetic end of things and I usually only think about the question of (propositional) truth from the fictive lens, I was pleasantly surprised to find this book focused on the work of reading itself and not just on the question of how fictive claims may or may not have truth value. Addressing reading as a whole, however, is a huge task and maybe one that is too big for a single monograph. This book is an important start, though, and René van Woudenberg lays a foundation for a discussion of how different interpretations might produce different truths—politically, or aesthetically, or even individually. Van Woudenberg addresses both shallow reading and deep reading and argues effectively for the epistemic value of both. In a time (or political climate) where it seems that truth is becoming too malleable to tell the difference between different interpretations, it is nice to have a book that defends both different accounts of interpretation as well as solidly grounded truth. The book is well-written and accessible to philosophers, and it would be a welcome addition to courses on analytic epistemology that are looking for an expanded view of sources of truth. It would also work in an aesthetics course looking to expand the limited explanations of how truth is possible in reference to literary fictions.

Van Woudenberg starts with the claim that “reading can and does expand our knowledge” (1) not just because we are taking in propositional truth, but because the act of reading itself is a form of organization of information. Philosophers often make problems out of what most people take as obvious, but this is one that I think is actually very important—what is it that we can gain epistemologically from reading. Reading here is posed in contrast to someone telling me something, me remembering something happening, or me seeing something. Typically, van Woudenberg claims, epistemologists agree that perception, memory, reason, and testimony all provide various kinds of knowledge (4) but reading per se has not had the attention it is due as a form of knowledge itself. Van Woudenberg starts with the suggestion that the act of reading is distinct from both testimony and perception and after an analysis of seven distinct theories of interpretation, he acknowledges that although reading and interpretation are often indistinguishable, there is a way in which we can separate the two. He ultimately suggests that both reading and interpretation can offer us distinct access to truth. Truth is not a necessary outcome since understanding, belief, and of course falsity of claims about states of affairs might interfere in our accessing truth, but to argue that truth is even on the table as an epistemic outcome of the practice of reading in and of itself is both bold and an extremely important kind of argument to make.

Van Woudenberg claims that the act of reading can provide one with propositional theories of truth (this is a largely contested claim). He claims that reading-truth can be backed by both a justified true belief account as well as Fred Dretske’s information-theoretic account. He asserts that reading can produce knowledge according to either account. He also asserts that “acquaintance knowledge,” which is like Mark Johnson’s “knowledge of what something is like” without necessarily having direct perceptual experience with the thing, is knowledge that can exist without belief, although it may not be the same kind of knowledge as propositional knowledge (27). He explains that “reading often does give rise to the kind of knowledge by acquaintance under discussion: it is through reading that a reader comes to entertain certain propositions and not others” (31). Ultimately, Van Woudenberg does discuss reading fiction as a form of acquaintance knowledge because it has a kind of “what-is-it-like experience of something that no one has firsthand experience of” (31). Through reading fiction, no one can have first person experience of any particular state of affairs but they can have a what-is-it-like experience. He then argues that knowing-how is also something that can be transmitted through reading despite several accounts that deny this (he notes Adam Carter and Ted Poston in particular). Reading instructions about how to calculate sales tax, how to get from one place to another, or how to tend roses are examples he gives of ways in which we can gain know-how, despite maybe not being able to gain knowledge of how to play a particular piano sonata or how to accurately sink a basketball in the net every time. He suggests that accounts that deny that we can gain knowledge of knowing-how suffer from a “one-sided diet of examples” (34). He rightly notes that the possibility that one might be able to gain knowledge-how from reading depends on both the complexity of the know-how and the abilities of the reader to understand and to execute some set of instructions. Of course, it also depends on the reader’s receptiveness to the instruction and their capacity to understand the instruction. Ultimately, he asserts that reading can provide us with propositional knowledge, acquaintance knowledge, and know-how. I believe these to be controversial claims, especially with propositional knowledge when he does not distinguish between fictive and factive texts. But he does address this distinction eventually. Much of the work van Woudenberg does is differentiating reading from other forms of information gathering. Reading requires accurate vision, but it is not merely a visual source of testimony. Reading is also not a simple kind of seeing. Reading requires vision, comprehension, understanding, and only then can it help one to refer properly.

The crux of van Woudenberg’s argument, I think, lies in his analysis of various forms of the interpretation of reading. He starts with a “generic” interpretation of meaning that one derives from reading a text. He states that “a statement, or a set of statements, is an interpretation of a text T, or of a part thereof, provided it attempts to specify the meaning or meanings of T, or of parts thereof” (176). He unpacks this nicely to allow it to function as the groundwork of what will happen in the following chapter (8) when he addresses seven other different kinds of meanings and interpretations. He distinguishes the following kinds of textual interpretations: allegorical, externalist, Freudian, holistic textual act, Marxist, modernist, and reader response theories. Van Woudenberg is right to acknowledge that we cannot appeal to only one theory of interpretation. Allegorical interpretation looks for something deeper than an externalist account, for example, and Freudian interpretations are going to appeal to very different contextual explanations for interpretation. Historically,  different needs and interests have been served by different kinds of interpretations, and it is, of course, essential that he differentiate these kinds. He notes also that along with identifying various kinds of interpretations, we also need not necessarily be engaged in any particular interpretation schema when we are reading to ascertain truth or knowledge. Van Woudenberg concludes his argument by claiming not that just that reading can be a source of knowledge, but that the act of interpretation itself should be considered a form of knowledge. He posits that all of the forms of interpretation he outlines can “trigger” a certain set of conditions appropriate for knowledge acquisition.

The book is interesting, and I think it opens the door to a number of different kinds of inquiries. One of the first things I thought of was that it is a kind of 21st century, very analytic defense against Socrates’ argument that things should not be written down. Socrates’ suggestion is that committing things to writing aids in forgetfulness, but I think what van Woudenberg might say in response is that there is a possibility for a much more extended story structure, argument, or explanation that can come from the written word than might be only remembered. Socrates was living in a much more oral story telling culture of course, but something as important as his own dialogues would not have been remembered or understood as completely or as accurately as they have been had Plato not committed them to the written word. Our own written culture values the written word in the form of literature, argumentation, explanation, and demonstration in an incredibly complex way that I do not think could be communicated in ways other than in writing. We may have always implicitly assumed that knowledge is a necessary outcome of  reading, but van Woudenberg has made this assumption explicit and has argued forcefully for its tenability in this book.