The Epistemology of Resistance: Gender and Racial Oppression, Epistemic Injustice, and Resistant Imaginations

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José Medina, The Epistemology of Resistance: Gender and Racial Oppression, Epistemic Injustice, and Resistant Imaginations, Oxford University Press, 2013, 332pp., $35.00 (pbk), ISBN 9780199929047.

Reviewed by Ann Ferguson, University of Massachusetts Amherst


In this book on social epistemology, José Medina develops a complicated normative theory of epistemic justice that weaves together elements of Aristotelian virtue ethics, communicative ethics and radical contextual pragmatism. He focuses on the problems of the social arrogance of the privileged, which create the epistemic vices of ignorance and insensitivity (what he calls meta-blindness and emotional numbness). He argues that different social locations give those oppressed in them (he focuses on racialized and sexual minorities, and women) epistemic advantages that make them more likely to obtain epistemic virtues. Feminists and Marxist theorists will find references to the epistemological standpoint theories originally developed by Georg Lukács, Nancy Hartsock, Mary O'Brien, Sandra Harding, Dorothy Smith, Donna Haraway, and Patricia Hill Collins, but based on a different metaphysical and epistemic foundation: a combination of American (William James) pragmatism and French (Michel Foucault) radical "guerrilla" pluralism. Medina argues that we have an epistemic responsibility to develop not merely a double consciousness (following W. E. B. DuBois) but a multiplicitous or "kaleidoscopic" consciousness based on incorporating multiple perspectives that are in epistemic friction into an epistemic equilibrium. To do this we must form networks of solidarity across social differences so as to continually broaden and correct the production of individual and collective knowledge. I find Medina's book exciting, clarifying and innovative in his approach to the thinkers he brings together and the new metaphors, arguments and examples he presents to anchor his theory. But there are a number of points on which I remain unconvinced.

In chapter one, Medina claims that three important epistemic virtues that we should try to develop are: humility, curiosity/diligence and open mindedness, in contrast to the epistemic vices of arrogance, laziness, and close-mindedness (42). Unlike those who are privileged, oppressed subjects have the epistemic advantage of needing to understand the oppressor's perspective for various reasons, for example to avoid the negative consequences of the power of the privileged by finding more efficient ways to serve them. To do this most oppressed subjects learn to introject the perspective of the other (to put themselves in their shoes as it were, in order to understand how they experience the world).

A problem for an oppressed subject who lacks social power is a tendency toward ego skepticism -- doubting one's self-worth. Feminists (Sandra Bartky, Beauvoir) and anti-racists (du Bois, Frantz Fanon) have pointed out this problem that women and people of color in a racist society have when they introject dominant norms that devalue them. But oppressed subjects often experience the dominant worldview as alien because it does not reflect their experience. This provides such subjects an opportunity to develop attitudes of curiosity and open-mindedness toward alternative ways of understanding social reality, thus developing the epistemic virtue Medina calls "meta-lucidity". Medina argues that by experiencing an epistemic friction between two or more ways of seeing the world (i.e., conflicting knowledge claims) we are able to advance knowledge. But this is only if we act by what he calls the "regulative principles of epistemic friction'" (29), which involve both the principle of acknowledgment of and engagement with the perspectives of others, and the principle of epistemic equilibrium, which allows us to understand the line between our individual subjectivity and the inter-subjectivity that involves us with others. While he admits that the line between self and other is blurred due to introjection and projection, he thinks such a line can still be drawn. Of course this is easier said than done, since privileged people tend to have arrogant views of themselves while oppressed peoples may struggle with feelings of inferiority. Just how, for example, does a woman in love, taught to put her lover's desires and needs above her own and introjecting her lover's desires, learn to create a normative equilibrium between his demands on her and her right to have her own needs met (that he fails to acknowledge in part because of arrogant ignorance)?

Chapter two discusses the important concept of the 'social imaginary' as a mechanism which can encourage epistemic vice in the privileged by ceding them an excess of epistemic authority while imposing a deficit of such (including testimonial injustice) on subordinated peoples. Examples include the way the racist and sexist social imaginary prevalent in the American South through slavery to the mid-twentieth century encouraged meta-blindness toward African Americans and white women, as shown in the trial of an innocent black man accused of abusing a white woman in To Kill a Mockingbird. Medina uses this story to show how epistemic resistance to challenging one's habitual ignorance of subordinated others can and did lead both to a deficit in knowledge of those others as well as a deficit in self-knowledge for most of the whites involved.

I question whether epistemic resistance to certain facts should always be judged an epistemic deficit. While it is easy to condemn white ignorance of institutional racism or one's own racist behavior as an epistemic deficit, other cases raise the question of what counts as an epistemic deficit, or vice. For example, is it so obvious that the false belief of an oppressed person that racism is only an individual problem is an epistemic vice, particularly if such a hope motivates her to continue to fight against racism? I suppose it could be argued that in this case the person may be morally justified in maintaining an epistemic deficit or vice because of the good consequences it yields, but it could also be argued that in such a circumstance the false belief ought no longer be counted as a deficit or vice of any sort!

Medina is on more plausible normative ground with his argument that epistemic justice is interactive, comparative and contrastive. As he points out, epistemic harms are done not only to the speaker, but also to the hearer when testimonial injustice is involved. In the example of the testimonial injustice in To Kill a Mockingbird, the dominant racist social imaginary "produces active ignorance by circulating distorted scripts about sexual desire according to which Negroes have a sexual agency out of control whereas women lack sexual agency" (68).

In spite of what Medina calls situated "hermeneutical inequality" (i.e., where one group cannot make sense of their own experiences if they go by the dominant social imaginary, as in domestic or racial violence in supposedly free and equal societies), he argues that this can provide an interpretive advantage to oppressed groups to challenge epistemic ignorance. But in order for such an alternative perspective to be effective in providing the epistemic friction which motivates correctives to oppressive social imaginaries, there need to be counter-publics (i.e., social movements) which forge different perspectives, counter-memories and a political space so that privileged people may correct their "impoverished affective structures" (81). Citing Karen Jones and Miranda Fricker (80-81) Medina claims that privileged people must find a way to overcome their lack of empathy and trust toward stigmatized groups, since this affective state perpetuates the privileged in meta-ignorance against such groups. And somehow this will need to involve the "polis and its citizens simultaneously . . . to change their ethical, their political, and their epistemic ways of relating" (85).

In his discussion (chapter four) on culpable ignorance and epistemic responsibility, Medina supports Iris Young's social connection theory of political responsibility. With her he argues that we are epistemically responsible for understanding the social harms that are caused by institutional structures in which we share resources and social spaces, and are more or less so depending on the relative power and privilege we have. This "Maxim of Eminent Relevance" (157) is one of the maxims he formulates to solve what he calls the "Relevance Dilemma", that is, how to determine which others it is relevant to know about. I am not convinced that this maxim or the other one, "the Maxim of Openness and Critical Vigilance" (157), solve the Relevance Dilemma. In one sense globalization has made it possible that all of us share the resources of the world, but capitalist rules of property prevent this. So are all of us with any property at all implicated in political responsibility for, and responsibility to know, all the harms that the economic and political structures we take part in cause the world's peoples? This seems much too broad an epistemic duty for us ever to achieve it!

The rest of this chapter cites important examples raised by Uma Narayan and Ladelle McWhorter, which detail how sexual and racial domination have produced intersecting bodies of ignorance, some produced through scientific discourses like eugenics, that pathologized and dehumanized poor people, sexual and racial minorities, and women (195). As Narayan points out, Western feminist theories of the victimization of Third World women totalize non-Western cultures to critique them (as in dowry murder in India) and fail to make comparisons with similar violence that happens in the West (as in domestic violence).

In chapter five Medina pursues in more depth everyday struggles for epistemic justice, referring to insights of various feminist authors, including Adrienne Rich, Linda Alcoff and Shannon Sullivan, who discuss white blindness/solipsism. He also refers to the outsiders within highlighted by Hill Collins, Alison Wiley and Sullivan, who are well positioned to have the double consciousness necessary to challenge these practices. He then focuses on those he calls "epistemic heroes", specifically Rosa Parks and Sor Juan Inés de la Cruz, who challenged the epistemic silencing caused by institutional racism and sexism. In describing the epistemological consciousness of such resisters, Medina argues that their meta-lucidity is achieved when there is a balance between dominant and subjugated perspectives "so that there can be mutual resistance and beneficial friction and not a mere overpowering of one perspective by the other (which would simply reproduce internally the relation of subordination and cognitive domination that characterizes oppression)" (198). But I do not understand this explanation, which strikes me as fatally vague. What does this balance between perspectives mean in a particular case? Does it mean, for example, that Parks's black pride overcomes any introjected white racism, or that de la Cruz's pride in a self-defined femininity overcomes dominant patriarchal denigrations of femininity? How is this a "balance"? Or does it mean challenging the binary altogether (which could be critiqued as an assimilationist stance that does not deal with the power asymmetries in the binaries pointed out by both Fanon and Beauvoir?) It strikes me that the metaphor of "balance" or "equilibrium" either does not address the power inequalities involved, or else reduces to a humanist assumption that there is a rational Rawlsian self able to abstract their social identity from given meanings of any social location.

On the other hand, I really like the way Medina argues that activists Parks and de la Cruz are not epistemic heroes in the individualist model, since they are only able to achieve their epistemic authority because of "chained actions" caused by collectives of people and social movements who take them as emblematic acts that give new ways to understand resistance to social injustice. Medina also convincingly rejects the dilemma that poses resistance either as individual actions of counter-performativity (Judith Butler) or as caused by a habitus in Pierre Bourdieu's sense, determined by social structures and norms. Butler argues that this notion of habitus would make impossible individual acts of resistance like Parks's, but Medina argues that a better explanation is to see Parks as having cultivated a habitus of resistance within the developing Civil Rights movement, so her action involves both individual and collective agency (240).

In the final chapter, Medina asks the key question: How do social imaginaries become exclusionary and stigmatizing, "making certain groups vulnerable to expressive and epistemic harms, and promoting the social tolerance of their suffering" (252)? The answer seems to be that our individual agencies and memories are bound up with chained actions and collective memories that link us to collective productions of knowledge and ignorance. These in turn can only be undone by individual and collective acts of epistemic resistance, including (borrowed from Foucault) "insurrections of subjugated knowledges" (14, 289).

There is an implicit tendency toward idealism in Medina's approach: our ideas and beliefs seem to be given causal primacy as the key to other kinds of social harms, such as ethical and political injustice. Does this underestimate how political and economic interests, and not just the mental vices of epistemic ignorance, cause social harms?

I note that capitalism as a structural cause of oppression (and epistemic ignorance) is nowhere mentioned; indeed the term "capitalism" does not even appear in the index! Class discrimination is mentioned only in passing, since the emphasis is on discrimination based on social identity locations: examples of epistemic privilege and oppression/silencing focus heavily on racial, ethnic, gender and sexual locations and social identity experiences/phenomenologies. Indeed, while social structures of domination are mentioned abstractly, they are rarely discussed in detail. Racial segregation is only mentioned in conjunction with Parks's struggle against bus segregation and not as an ongoing issue, the gender division of waged and unwaged labor is nowhere mentioned, nor is present-day unequal racial and class distribution of power and resources caused by slavery or by wage labor and capitalist appropriation. And yet this is a book that claims to give a genealogical analysis of power based on a Foucauldian "guerrilla pluralism"!

Medina's solution to epistemic injustice stresses a multicultural diversity approach, a "kaleidoscopic", multiplicitous set of perspectives developed by both individuals and collectives in solidarity networks. Following Carol Gould, he defines solidarity as a disposition to act toward others who are recognized as different from oneself, in the sense of being differently situated. In contrast to views of solidarity as binding those who share an identity or other sameness together, he argues that

network solidarity is not achieved at the expense of differences, but rather, through relations that preserve differences. . . . Networks of solidarity are formed by weaving together problems, values, and goals, that though often irreducibly different, can overlap, converge, or simply be coordinated so that they can be addressed simultaneously and enjoy mutual support. (308)

But this characterization of solidarity is itself a normative one, and begs the question against other views of solidarity that see it as uniting people around a common cause, and thus in that sense requiring unification. What about the classic principle of Solidarity Justice as requiring from each according to their ability, to each according to their needs cited by Marx (cf. Ferguson 2009)? And how would Medina's contextual pluralist epistemic pragmatism give us a concrete principle of justice to decide whether and in what contexts trans-women should be included in autonomous political support groups for biologically born, or cis-women? Though he quotes Naomi Scheman and Young's optimistic prediction that the women's movement has become more pluralistic in its acceptance of gender deviant folk, hence "queering gender binaries", this is true only of parts of certain women's movements in certain countries. Indeed, the lack of unification around this issue of how to challenge patriarchal gender binaries still remains a basic problem not solved by radical pluralism or a re-definition of solidarity through networks.

In conclusion, Medina's approach to epistemic justice and injustice, which creatively combines a number of classical philosophical perspectives, has given us innovative ways of analyzing the connections between knowledge, ignorance, and social injustice, but he needs to address more fully how and which sort of solidarity is possible (Ferguson 2010) and, perhaps by investigating a contextual communitarian approach (cf. Paredes 2010), the ways that feminisms with different beliefs and cultures can unify around fighting some common enemies while holding different contextual political strategies.


Ferguson, Ann 2009. "Feminist Paradigms of Solidarity and Justice". Philosophical Topics. Vol. 37, no. 2, Fall 2009: 161-177.

Ferguson, Ann 2010. "How is Global Solidarity Possible?" Kathleen B. Jones and Anna Jónasdóttir, eds. Sexuality, Gender, and Power. London: Routledge: 243-258.

Paredes, Julieta 2010. Hilando Fino: Desde el femnismo comunitario (La Paz, Bolivia: Moreno Arts Gráficas).