The Equality of the Sexes: Three Feminist Texts of the Seventeenth Century

Placeholder book cover

Desmond M. Clarke (ed., tr.), The Equality of the Sexes: Three Feminist Texts of the Seventeenth Century, Oxford University Press, 2013, 220pp., $35.00 (pbk), ISBN 9780199673513.

Reviewed by Marcy P. Lascano, California State University, Long Beach


A number of texts concerning the querelle des femmes (the quarrel about women or the woman question, as we now say) appeared during the medieval era and throughout the Renaissance. Authors like Jean de Meun, Christine de Pizan, Agrippa, Boccaccio, and Lucrezia Marinella (among others) debated whether men were superior to women, or women to men. These texts typically provided arguments based on religious and philosophical authority, as well as examples of either illustrious or notorious women to support claims that women were either superior or inferior to men. However, in the early modern period, we see the emergence of texts supporting the equality of men and women.1 This book brings together, for the first time, seventeenth century feminist texts by Marie le Jars de Gournay (1568-1645), Anna Maria van Schurman (1607-1678), and François Poulain de la Barre (1647-1723) that argue for such equality. Clarke has provided new translations from the original French and Latin texts and supplemented each primary text with additional shorter texts, excerpts, and letters that give insight into the main text. I begin with a brief description of the texts and their arguments and then turns to issues concerning the value and quality of the volume.

The book begins with Marie le Jars de Gournay's The Equality of Men and Women (1622) and her short work The Ladies' Complaint (1626). In Equality, Gournay provides counter-arguments to the thesis that all women are inferior -- both intellectually and morally -- to men. Gournay's text, with its frequent use of examples of illustrious women, closely resembles earlier querelle texts. However, she uses these examples in support of her argument that the general thesis of women's inferiority is easily countered by examples of particular women, both ancient and modern, who were equal to men in intellect or virtue (a claim she makes more explicit in The Ladies' Complaint). In addition, she argues that, since the essential attribute of human beings is the rational soul, which God has provided to both men and women, there is no reason to believe that one sex is superior to the other.

Gournay also deals with biblical passages used by her opponents to support the inferiority of women, such as the claim that "the husband is the head of his wife" (73).2 Gournay points to Genesis I:27 when she writes, "Mankind was created male and female, according to Scripture, while counting the two of them as only one creation" (65). She argues, "Now, in those whose nature is one and the same, one must conclude that their actions are also the same, and that their esteem and praise are therefore equal when their works are equal" (66). She claims that given numerous passages in scripture that show "the unity of the sexes," we can know that declarations that seem to indicate women's inferiority to men are made "only because of the explicit need to foster peace within marriages" (73).

Finally, Gournay offers an explanation for the apparent disparity between the intellectual powers of men and women, viz., that women are not provided with good education. She argues that it is likely that if women were given the same sort of education as men, we would perceive no gap in their intellectual powers (59-60).

The featured work by Anna Maria van Schurman is A Dissertation on the Natural Capacity of Women for Study and Learning (1641). It is supplemented with excerpts from her correspondence with André Rivet, Princess Elizabeth of Bohemia, and Gournay, as well as excerpts from her autobiography, Eukleria (1673). The Dissertation concerns the question whether a Christian woman should be educated. As Clarke notes in his introduction, arguments claiming Christian women should not be educated focused on (1) women's natural incapacity for study or their social status, which prevented the means for study, (2) the unfitting nature of study for a Christian woman, and (3) the needlessness of education for those who are barred from any profession that might require it (22).

Van Schurman's text, with its succinct syllogistic arguments, is written in the style of a Scholastic disputation. In it, she provides fourteen arguments in favor of the thesis that a Christian woman should be educated. In addition, she provides five objections to the thesis that a Christian woman should not be educated. Van Schurman argues that women, in general, are as capable as men of intellectual pursuits. However, she is very clear to state that some women, due to lack of capacity or interest or to lack of time or resources, are incapable of study. But, she notes, this is true of men as well, and it does nothing to show that women and men are not equal in terms of their capacity for reason. Van Schurmanargues that God gives every human being reason, and that God does nothing in vain. Thus, every human being is meant to use his or her natural reasoning capacities insofar as they are able. In addition, we have a duty to follow God's commands and to be morally virtuous. In order to properly understand scripture and to avoid heresy and vice, it is necessary to study a great variety of subjects, including grammar, logic, rhetoric, physics, metaphysics, history, and languages (especially Hebrew and Greek) (81).

Late in life, van Schurman underwent a religious conversion and became a follower of Jean de Labadie. One of the beliefs held by Labadie was that God's grace is available to all, regardless of class, sex, or intellectual ability (8). This led van Schurman to reject her former view that study and intellectual pursuits were necessary for being a good Christian. The excerpts from Eukleria give us insight into the extent of her rejection of the importance of study and intellectual improvements.

The last section contains François Poulain de la Barre's A Physical and Moral Discourse concerning the Equality of Both Sexes (1673), and it is supplemented with an excerpt from his Conversations Concerning the Education of Ladies (1674). The longest of the three texts, Poulain's Discourse aims to show that the thesis that women are inferior to men is based on prejudice (judgments made without examination) and custom rather than on knowledge (which Poulain held could only be had through the Cartesian method of clear and distinct ideas). Poulain argues that "women have been dominated and excluded from public life" (120). He claims that it is only custom and men's self-interest in maintaining power for themselves that keep women from being educated and allowed into civic and religious positions. He writes, "These arguments result from the belief that men are impartial and from a widespread false concept of custom: if some practice is well-established, then we think that it must be right" (125). This argument is echoed in The Education of Ladies when he writes,

Since the agreement of many people about the same thing shows merely that it was approved rather than that it was true, we should likewise conclude from their opposition to some opinion that it was merely challenged rather than that it was erroneous, and that it had the misfortune of being the weakest opinion rather than the worst. (206-7)

Poulain argues that women's natural tendencies towards eloquence, understanding (in spite of their lack of training), charity, and kindness make them well-suited to many pursuits. In addition, he holds that women have a greater awareness of sensory input, more vivid imaginations, and keener memories than men. Although these same traits can lead to the appearance of vice in women (by, for instance, making them more easily distracted or excitable), Poulain argues that proper education transforms these traits -- which are good in themselves -- into productive habits. He argues that women are capable of every kind of learning and should be permitted to enter the professions to which such training would naturally lead. He points out the circularity of arguments made by opponents of equality claiming that women need not be educated because they are barred from holding civic and religious positions, while also arguing that women should be barred from holding such positions because they want education.

The main question specialists will have about this volume is why is it needed? After all, there are recent English translations of these texts in The Other Voice In Early Modern Europe series from The University of Chicago Press. A volume on van Schurman appeared in 1998, and volumes on Gournay and Poulain were published in 2002. The answer is mainly that this edition provides translations, an introduction, and extensive notes by a philosopher for those interested in the philosophy. Although the Other Voice series is a valuable tool for those of us who work on early modern women and feminist philosophers (I own and admire numerous volumes), there is no doubt that the translations, introductions, and notes are often not geared towards the concerns and interests of those who work in the history of philosophy.3

Clarke's volume, by contrast, is fit to serve as the authoritative English translation of these works for our field. First, in comparison with other available texts, Clark's translation structures the English sentences so that the argumentation is transparent. In addition, he is careful to note potentially controversial choices in the translation of words like scientia,homo and précieuses.

Clarke's introduction is quite substantial (at 53 pages, it is nearly a quarter of the book). It is also invaluable. He does an excellent job of setting the context of these debates, providing brief biographical sketches of the philosophers and very detailed analyses of the arguments found in the texts. His introduction provides enough background and guidance to make the volume suitable for use in the classroom as well as for research.

Finally, the footnotes are quite extensive. Clarke has done an extraordinary job of tracking down references to rather obscure texts and figures, a task for which he acknowledges the help of numerous experts in related disciplines. He provides brief biographical information for those named in the text, figures as varied as Ulpian, Corina of Boeotia, Hortensia, and Huldah. In addition, when an author quotes or misquotes, he supplies the original and notes the discrepancies. He also has provided an index and citations for further reading.

Clarke's collection is also valuable merely for having gathered these texts into a single volume. When read in succession, thematic similarities and similarities in argumentative structure are more readily apparent, which facilitates fruitful comparative analysis. The effects of various theological concerns, differences among Stoic, Scholastic, and Cartesian methodologies, and the influence of custom and prejudice all become much more salient when we see these texts as related, rather than reading each philosopher on his or her own.

1 See Eileen O'Neill. "The Equality of Men and Women" in The Oxford Handbook of Philosophy in Early Modern Europe. Edited by Desmond Clarke and Catherine Wilson. Oxford: Oxford University Press, 2011: 445-474. O'Neill discusses the extent to which those in the earlier periods of the debate can be said to argue for equality.

2 Clarke notes this is in reference to Ephesians 5:21-22.

3 Two recent notable exceptions to this claim are Lisa Shapiro's volume, The Correspondence between Princess Elizabeth of Bohemia and René Descartes, and Jacqueline Broad's volume on Mary Astell's The Christian Religion (in the Toronto series). Of course, this is likely due to the fact that both Shapiro and Broad are philosophers.