The Equivocation of Reason: Kleist Reading Kant

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James Phillips, The Equivocation of Reason: Kleist Reading Kant, Stanford University Press, 2007, 160pp., $50.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780804755870.

Reviewed by Robert Norton, University of Notre Dame


This is an often exhilarating and yet ultimately frustrating book -- which is, one suspects, just as its author would have it.  Phillips is clearly a gifted, even brilliant, philosopher, with a rare talent for condensing complex thoughts on which others would expend far more words, and far less insight, into pithy, epigrammatic gems.  "The concept of the thing in itself is Kant's security against a Promethean uprising of sensibility" (6), reads a far from atypical sentence.  "The critical philosophy, as it were, dethrones the Platonic Idea and transforms it into a brigand" (4), another declares.  Or, to offer a final example: "In its suspension of the laws of nature, the ethical act is a descendent of the miracle" (43-44).

Aphoristic pronouncements such as these exemplify, in equally concise form, both the power and the weakness of Phillips's approach.  Ostensibly a book tracing the origin, nature, meaning and outcome of Kleist's famous misreading of Kant known as his "Kant-Krise," it is at once much more and far less than a straightforward retelling of that familiar story.  Phillips is shrewd enough, as well as intellectually ambitious enough, to dispense with all but the barest of information extraneous to the deeper problems that interest him.  Thus the book offers no orientation to the uninitiated reader toward either Kant or Kleist themselves, nor indeed toward any other of the figures he mentions, often in passing, who range from the familiar -- including Aristotle, Descartes, Spinoza, Freud and Deleuze -- to the truly obscure, such as Johann Karl Wilhelm Palm and Johann Patzke.  Who these people were, and why they merit inclusion, is left to the reader to deduce -- or not.  But the intention is not to cultivate an esoteric aura for its own sake.  Rather, the intransigence of the text, its simultaneous offer and withdrawal of illumination or understanding, is not merely a rhetorical strategy; it is an integral part of Phillips's argument and throughout informs his reading of Kleist reading Kant.  As Phillips phrases it toward the end of the book, "for Kleist, the breakdown of comprehension that Kant names the sublime is less an occasional experience of the limit of thought than its proper domain" (110).  Putting an even finer, if paradoxical, point on this "breakdown," Phillips claims that "this comprehending incomprehension is really no more and no less than the key to Kleist's" thought (110-111).  There is more here than what Phillips elsewhere keenly calls the "stalled dialectic of deconstruction" (6).  It represents the attempt to think through the consequences of what it means to translate a total loss of faith in the ability of the mind to attain truth into a literary practice that has not yet lost its belief in the possibility of reproducing the world.

Given such a complex design, it is a very short book, composed of only two chapters enclosed by a relatively brisk Introduction and Conclusion.  Moreover, Phillips focuses almost exclusively on just two works by Kleist, the play Penthesilea and the essay "Über das Marionettentheater" ("On the Puppet Theater").  This relative paucity of textual examples to illustrate his larger theoretical concerns is, however, reflective of the problem Phillips sets out to explore in the book as a whole, and indeed is, albeit indirectly, explicitly thematized as a larger challenge faced more generally by philosophically driven literary criticism.  "Philosophy cannot approach art unless the latter adopts the guise of allegory and represents what is already philosophical," Phillips writes in characteristically apodictic fashion, "but if philosophy is to acquire anything from the encounter, the guise must come apart in the most concrete manner" (52).  The Kantian substratum of this argument is clear: art resides in the realm of the particular, and a great work of art owes no small part of its greatness to its absolute singularity, its irreducible uniqueness.  This very property is antithetical to the universalizing impetus of philosophy, which seeks to identify the general laws governing all phenomena.  In the encounter between art and philosophy, each must make accommodations to the other if anything productive is to emerge -- a philosophical analysis of a literary text, for instance, cannot expect that text to follow strictly logical rules of demonstration, and a literary text cannot have no referential possibilities outside of itself.  But the specific character of each must be finally maintained: a literary work must retain some element of its concrete specificity even as it gestures beyond itself, just as a philosophical argument cannot forever dispense with generalizeable principles in its analysis of particulars.  It is this irresolvable tension, this inability of literature and philosophy to inhabit the same space, as it were, that lies at the center of Phillips's book and his understanding of the deeper meaning of Kleist's "Kant Crisis."  For if, in Kleist's hysterical misconception of Kant's critical philosophy, truth is no longer even theoretically possible, then a literature arising out of this conclusion would point in both directions toward a void.  This is the import of Phillips's finding: "Penthesilea is the 'allegory' of the unrepresentable; that is to say, it is an allegory that 'operates' by failing" (52).  For Phillips, Kleist's works enact his realization that understanding in any conventional meaning of the word is no longer possible.

The bulk of the book is devoted to teasing out the "irreconcilable perspectives" (23) that Phillips thus sees as constitutive of Kleist's writing.  In practice, however, this means that he spends far more time discussing Kant than Kleist.  Partly that is an almost inevitable consequence of Phillips's approach, given the virtually unbridgeable divide he sees between philosophy and literature.  Nor is the greater focus on Kant regrettable for its own sake, for Phillips has many highly original and thought-provoking takes on ostensibly familiar Kantian topics.  Regarding Kant's ethics, for instance, which stands at the center of the first chapter, Phillips delivers a vigorous rethinking of the meaning of freedom, showing how it is entirely incompatible with the empirical realm: a freedom that is bound in any way -- including by any positive law -- thereby ceases to be freedom.  Only a Law devoid of any content, infinitely distant from actuality, can serve as a reference point for freedom thus conceived.  The consequence, as Phillips describes it, is a terrible erosion of the real world, the realm of positivity, into complete relativity, or contingency: "Once the Law enters into hostility with the laws, everything positive undergoes the nihilistic fate of being devalued into values" (43).  In this way, Phillips wants to show that the terror Kleist experienced when confronted by the critical philosophy was entirely warranted: Kant's elevation of Reason necessarily entailed the derogation of the world.  This is also where the two writers meet, or as Phillips puts it: "Kant and Kleist together pursue a work of destruction" (72).  But whereas Kant destroys the world for the sake of philosophy, Kleist takes the fragmented pieces that no longer cohere as the signs of a kind of negative truth.  For Kleist, error becomes the supreme, indeed sole principle.

All this makes for exciting reading, certainly, but in the end I am not convinced it makes for good literary criticism.  So much of what Phillips elaborates is cast at such a far remove from Kleist himself that for long stretches Kleist disappears entirely from view.  In the first chapter, barely fifteen pages are given to a detailed discussion of Penthesilea, and even fewer, probably no more than five, deal directly with "On the Puppet Theater" in the second chapter.  Again, this seems the unavoidable result of an approach that insists that philosophy and literature are fundamentally antithetical to each other.  But there are only so many ways to say that there is nothing to be said.  This, too, is a theme that Phillips explicitly strikes in the Conclusion to his book, in which he characterizes "Kleist's despair" as a kind of auto-critique of the Enlightenment more broadly.  "In the conventional sense," Phillips therefore concludes, "the Enlightenment has nothing to say" (119).  And that is of course the final paradox of this paradoxical work, a kind of cunning refutation that is simultaneously an affirmation of Wittgenstein's famous proposition that "what we cannot speak of we must pass over in silence."  To take up the challenge implied in this dictum and yet remain faithful to its spirit is perhaps the greatest achievement of this remarkable book.