The Essence of Human Freedom: An Introduction to Philosophy and The Essence of Truth: On Plato's Cave Allegory and Theaetetus

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Heidegger, Martin, The Essence of Human Freedom: An Introduction to Philosophy, trans. Ted Sadler, Continuum, 2002, 216pp, $29.95 (pbk), ISBN 0826459242.

Heidegger, Martin, The Essence of Truth: On Plato's Cave Allegory and Theaetetus, trans. Ted Sadler, Continuum, 2002, 252pp, $29.95 (pbk), ISBN 0826459226.

Reviewed by William McNeill, DePaul University


The appearance in English of two of Heidegger’s most important Freiburg lecture courses from the early 1930s—The Essence of Human Freedom, from summer semester 1930, and The Essence of Truth, delivered in winter semester 1931/32—marks a major and significant contribution to the accessibility of this pivotal period of Heidegger’s thought for the English-speaking world. Together, these courses document the inseparability of Heidegger’s thought from a critical and ongoing dialogue with the philosophical tradition. They serve at once to illuminate texts of Plato, Aristotle, and Kant, to clarify the significance and stance of Heidegger’s own thinking, and to display Heidegger’s unique and meticulous pedagogical style. Although both volumes have been available in German since the 1980s (The Essence of Human Freedom was published in 1982, The Essence of Truth in 1988), they have been largely ignored by Heidegger scholarship outside of Germany. Their publication in English is a welcome event.

The first volume, The Essence of Human Freedom, presents itself as an introduction to philosophy as a whole by way of what appears to be just one particular, regional question: that of human freedom. And yet, Heidegger suggests, the distinction of philosophical questioning perhaps lies in the fact that it always reveals the whole in and through—and only in and through—the unfolding of particular questions. This does not, however, mean that in philosophizing we simply broaden our field of view in order better to situate and understand our particular theme—in regard to the question of freedom, for example, also taking God and world into our view as that in relation to which freedom (as negative freedom, freedom from…) is situated. It means, rather, a concern with the whole that “goes to our own roots,” that challenges us in the very grounds of our being. Taking his lead from Kant’s understanding of practical freedom, as ultimately grounded in transcendental freedom, Heidegger quickly moves from Kant’s understanding of freedom in terms of causality to argue that causality at once directs us back to the phenomenon of movement in general, which, as a fundamental determination of beings that varies in accordance with the kind of beings involved, directs us toward the question of beings as such—of “what beings in their breadth and depth actually are”—and thus to the “leading question” (Leitfrage) of philosophy: ti to on, what are beings? (German 31/translation, 23).

From here, Heidegger suggests that this question, while raised by Plato and Aristotle, was nevertheless not genuinely or radically unfolded by them; thus, it is our prerogative, he states, but also our responsibility, “to become the murderers of our forefathers,” and indeed to succumb to such a fate ourselves: “Only then, can we arrive at the problematic in which they immediately existed, but precisely for this reason were not able to work through to final transparency.” (37/27). What follows is an extensive excursus (of some 50 pages) inquiring into the multiple meanings of being in Aristotle, starting from the basic Greek word for being, ousia, and culminating in an important interpretation of Metaphysics IX, 10, where Heidegger argues that Aristotle’s understanding of the most proper being of what properly is (beings proper) as being true (to on alethes as kuriotaton on), that is, as the deconcealment of what presents itself in sheer presence, not only constitutes an integral part of Metaphysics IX (contrary to what some commentators have suggested), but contains “the keystone of Book IX, which itself is the center of the entire Metaphysics.” (107/75). And yet, Heidegger notes, this chapter also documents something of the growing exclusion of the possibility of untruth from truth: the sheer unhiddenness of something straightforwardly (haplos) or simply given, apprehended by nous, of itself excludes any possibility of distortion or error, of apprehending what is given as something other than itself.

Following a very brief discussion of the culmination of this Greek understanding of being as sheer presence in Hegel, Heidegger, reverting to the problematic of Being and Time, suggests not only that the fundamental Greek understanding of being as presence “receives its illumination” from time itself, but that the leading question of philosophy (what are beings?) must be transformed into the fundamental or grounding question (Grundfrage), “i.e, into the question which inquires into the ‘and’ of being and time and thus into the ground of both.” (116/81). In little more than ten condensed, yet incredibly compelling pages, Heidegger then seeks to show that this ground, which lies “prior even to being and time” and constitutes “the ground of the possibility of existence, the root of being and time,” is nothing other than freedom. Freedom, however, is no longer to be understood as a property of man; at most the converse is the case: “man as a possibility of freedom,” freedom as the “awesome’ (ungeheuerliche) ground wherein the disclosure or deconcealment of beings as such and as a whole occurs. (133–35/93–94). These pivotal pages of the book not only retrieve in a transformed manner Heidegger’s analyses of time from 1924 through 1930, but also show Heidegger attempting to take a further, decisive step along the path opened up by The Fundamental Concepts of Metaphysics: World, Finitude, Solitude, the important lecture course delivered in winter semester 1929–30.

In a somewhat surprising turn, Heidegger, rather than further developing the radical perspective just opened up, turns back to a consideration of freedom in Kant, and the last hundred pages of the course are devoted to this task. Heidegger, while intimating a series of complicated questions that lie ahead, deliberately chooses another path, one “which forces us into constant dialogue with the philosophers, in particular with Kant,” who was “the first to see the problem of freedom in its most radical philosophical consequences” (136–37/95). The entire analysis of Kant’s understanding of freedom, however, is situated under the question of whether freedom is a problem of causality (as in Kant), or whether, conversely, causality is a problem of freedom; of whether, indeed, freedom demands to be conceived more radically than in terms of causality at all. In the closing pages of the course, Heidegger argues that this is indeed the case, and that causality is grounded in freedom, not vice-versa. Here, Heidegger seeks to move beyond the Kantian perspective, which, he argues, fails to adequately interrogate the ontological character of the possibility and actuality of freedom. Freedom in a more primordial sense, he indicates, entails an “originary self-binding” that lies prior to the distinction between theoretical and practical knowledge and comportment.

The second volume, The Essence of Truth, presents a careful, step-by-step exegesis of two central arguments from Plato’s dialogues. The first, an analysis of the allegory of the cave from Book VII of the Republic, seeks to return to the original Greek experience of aletheia (truth) as “unhiddenness” or “unconcealment,” a sense of aletheia that Heidegger shows is a precondition for understanding truth as propositional correctness. The analysis of the allegory follows the different stages of the occurrence of truth as gradations of unhiddenness and of the prisoners’ relation to what becomes unhidden or revealed at each stage. In interpreting the central themes of the allegory—themes such as the progressive liberation of the prisoners; their turning toward the light; the essence of the ideas; the idea of the Good; the philosopher as liberator; the essence of paideia; and the fate of philosophizing—Heidegger, however, not only reads the allegory as a testament to the original power of unhiddenness in Greek existence, but also as an indication of the waning of this fundamental experience, such that Plato does not, in the allegory, ask concerning the essence of unhiddenness as such: “Plato equates the unhidden with what is (beings), in such a way that the question of unhiddenness as such does not come to life.” (German 123–24; translation, 89). That this is so, Heidegger argues, is evidenced by the fact that Plato fails to ask about the essence of hiddenness, as that from which unhiddenness must be wrested. Thus, the theme of unhiddenness has an ambiguous status in the allegory: “For Plato, therefore, unhiddenness is a theme, and at the same time not a theme. Because this is the situation with regard to un- hiddenness, an explicit clarification of the hiddenness of beings does not eventuate. But just this neglect of the question of hiddenness as such is the decisive indication of the already beginning ineffectiveness of un hiddenness in the strict sense… . For the unhiddenness of beings is precisely wrested from hiddenness, i.e., it is obtained in struggle against the latter.” (125/90-91).

From here, mindful of this failure to inquire into the essence of hiddenness and, as a consequence, into the essence of unhiddenness as such, Heidegger moves to the second dialogue of interest, namely the Theaetetus, for which he makes a striking claim: This dialogue, he claims, represents “that stretch of the road of the question concerning untruth which, for the first and last time in the history of philosophy, Plato actually trod …” (129/93). Here, in his analysis of the Theaetetus, Heidegger takes us through the various stages of the argument that unfolds from Theaetetus’ initial answer to what constitutes knowledge (episteme), namely, aisthesis, or sense-perception, to the problem of how wrong opinion (pseudes doxa) is possible. Heidegger’s interpretation shows not only how falsity and—as an apparent consequence—truth come to be conceived as uncorrectness and correctness of the propositional statement respectively (entailing both a shift away from the original experience of unhiddenness and a shift in the understanding of doxa), but also how truth and untruth thereby come to be viewed as mutually exclusive, contrary to the insight that lies close at hand in the cave-allegory, but is not taken up by Plato himself: namely, that “unhiddenness … in itself is simultaneously, and indeed essentially, hiddenness; a truth to whose essence there belongs un-truth.” (321/227). Yet Heidegger’s readings should not be seen as simply an indictment of Plato’s thought: not only do they succeed magnificently in bringing out the experiential and, one might say, phenomenological, basis of Plato’s thought—breathing new life into these dialogues; Heideggr’s insights into the essence of truth as unconcealment (being) are also ever mindful of the implications for his own “question of being.” As he notes toward the close of this volume: “Untruth belongs to the primordial essence of truth as the unhiddenness of being, i.e., to the inner possibility of truth. The question of being is thus thoroughly ambiguous—it is a question of the deepest truth and at the same time it is on the edge of, and in the zone of, the deepest untruth.” (322/228)

Each of these two volumes makes an important contribution to our understanding of the development of Heidegger’s own thinking as in constant dialogue with the philosophical tradition. They illuminate not only the philosophers he engages, but the metamorphoses of Heidegger’s own thinking of being as well. Anyone seeking to understand the shifting ground of Heidegger’s thinking of being and time from the late 1920s through the early 1930s will have to study The Essence of Human Freedom; those who are of the opinion that Heidegger has little or nothing to say about the phenomenon of the human body need to study the analyses of Platonic eros, sense-perception, bodily dispersion, and desire from The Essence of Truth. The translator has done a very fine job overall: the translations convey the sense of Heidegger’s difficult prose in a very readable and generally accurate manner. A few errors or inaccuracies that I discovered serve as a reminder that one should always consult the German when undertaking careful study: in The Essence of Human Freedom, the term existenziellen is rendered as “existential” (instead of “existentiell”) at one critical point (136/94); in On the Essence of Truth, “authentic” is at one point used to translate both eigenen and eigentlichen (238/170) although the two are quite distinct for Heidegger, eigenen really meaning “own”: thus, in this particular context, one’s own self could very well be at stake without one necessarily being authentic; in another place in the same volume, “hiddenness” appears instead of “unhiddenness” for Unverborgenheit (322/228)).