The Essence of the Self: In Defense of the Simple View of Personal Identity

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Geoffrey Madell, The Essence of the Self: In Defense of the Simple View of Personal Identity, Routledge, 2015, 144pp., $140.00 (hbk), ISBN 9781138823945.

Reviewed by Daniel Giberman, University of Gothenburg


In his new book on personal identity, Geoffrey Madell addresses the question, "What is it for states of consciousness, whether they occur at the same time or whether they occur over time, to be the conscious states of a single self?" (7, italics in original). The answer he defends is that there are "no logically constitutive criteria of the identity of the self" (ix). Rather, Madell claims, personal identity is "basic and not further analysable" (ix). This is the Simple View. Madell holds that personal identity centrally concerns the nature of and relations among conscious states as they obtain "from the point of view of the experiencing subject" (7). This first-person-focused claim is a crucial premise for the book's primarily critical project, which aims to show that virtually all familiar theories of personal identity fail fatally to account for the uniqueness of a given subject's experiential point of view. As Madell repeatedly puts the point, there is a "gap" between conditions set to establish that some collection of experiences belong to some one person, on the one hand, and, on the other, conditions that establish that any such person is me (or you or him). Given Madell's premise, adequacy demands conditions of the latter sort. However -- Madell argues with admirable ambition and tenacity -- the best the familiar theories can furnish are conditions of the former sort.

Madell's critical program, if sound, leaves many casualties in its wake. Among these are myriad explanatory accounts of the first person (Chapter 2); all body, organism-based, and psychological continuity accounts of diachronic and synchronic personal identity (Chapters 3 and 4); a popular reading of Descartes on mental substance, according to which the Cartesian self is a bare substratum (Chapters 3-6); and the thesis of the necessity of origin (Chapter 5). Anyone invested in any of these topics will find Madell's book worthy of perusal. Whether they ultimately will find it convincing is, of course, an open question. In the remainder of this review, I will focus primarily on some reasons for resisting Madell's case, though not for lack of finding the unity, scope, and potential power of his arguments impressive.

Chapter 1 nicely sets the agenda. The first person perspective is anointed as crucial to both personal identity and the mind/body problem. We see the first occurrence of Madell's claim that token experiences are -- essentially -- either mine or not mine. (Might some token experiences that are mine also be yours? Madell presumably would shout 'No!' from the rooftops, though he does not consider the question explicitly.) It follows from this claim, we are told (p. 3), that no satisfactory account of phenomenal character can be given until an account of the first-person nature of experience is given, and it is the book's central message that the same satisfaction constraint holds for accounts of personal identity.

There are two worries for Madell's project that arise already in Chapter 1, one of which he recognizes and addresses: explaining token subjectivity is simply not among the tasks undertaken by those seeking to account for the metaphysics of diachronic personal identity; so the complaint that this task is unmet is beside the point. Madell's response to this worry is that the "gap" between the third person and the first person slaps back. For any experience in a series of experiences putatively related by diachronic-identity-preserving continuities, Madell can still ask whether such continuities "allow one to infer that the experience in question is mine" (7). I find this response unsatisfying. If it is beside the point of metaphysical theorizing about diachronic identity whether the subject over time is me (in the robustly subjective sense), then it is equally beside the point whether a given experience at a given time is mine. The antecedent of the preceding conditional may be false, of course, but Madell's response does little to convince us that it is.

The second worry is that Madell is less clear than one might hope on whether the central issue of personal identity is metaphysical or epistemological. I will return to this general worry below, but it first arises in the case of the "gap" itself. We are told time and again that "no amount of information conveyed without recourse to indexicals can give the information that, for example, I am the person described in such-and-such a way" (4). But the crucial question concerns whether this inability to convey information without indexical concepts is ground for drawing metaphysical lessons as opposed to merely epistemological (or conceptual or semantic) ones. It is clear that Madell advocates the metaphysical lesson -- he says explicitly on page 5 that we must introduce special first-person facts into our ontology -- but less clear that his premises lead to it. He appeals to J.M.E. McTaggart and Sydney Shoemaker in defense of the "gap," but the upshot for metaphysics remains questionable.[1] We learn merely that McTaggart is concerned with whether we can know that certain descriptions apply to us, Shoemaker with how we can know that we've correctly identified ourselves (4).

Moreover, Madell many times invokes a passage from The Conscious Mind in which David Chalmers discusses the puzzling nature of the first person, entertaining the notion of primitive indexical facts.[2] What Madell does not mention, however, is that, in the passage in question, Chalmers points out that the relevant indexical fact may well fail to be "an objective fact about the world" rather than merely "a fact about the world as I find it."[3] Of course, for Madell, what matters is the world as each subject subjectively finds it; but as I remarked above, its so mattering to Madell does not yet establish that it matters to metaphysics (rather than only to epistemology), particularly insofar as metaphysics is taken to concern objective facts about the world.

Chapter 2 contains a sustained defense of the Simple View against numerous attempts in the literature to plug the "gap" between the third person and the first person. Madell says much here that rewards contemplation, but I will focus on his discussion of the first person and action. He raises a cart-before-horse objection to Shoemaker's claim[4] that the distinctive feature of first person beliefs is their role in determining action: "My accepting that a certain belief is a belief about myself cannot . . . consist in its moving me to action" since "it is because I believe something to be true of me that I act in a certain way" (20, italics in original). One might wonder here whether Madell is being entirely fair to the first person/action link. I doubt that those who have advocated the link require that first person beliefs must, as a matter of actual fact, move one to bodily action. Rather, the claim seems to be simply that the beliefs in question are uniquely apt for moving one to action, whether any such action takes place or not.[5] The link so understood is consistent with the causal relationship Madell highlights.

Chapter 3 is one place where the aforementioned worry about blurring metaphysics and epistemology arises. Madell here charges bodily theories of personal identity with a form of vicious circularity. As he puts it: "If connection to the body provides the link which explains . . . personal identity . . . then I would have to discover of any experience that it was so connected before I could ascribe any experience to myself" (39). Now, the suggested link between self and body, if sound, provides a metaphysical explanation of the self. But the (supposed) link need not be the sole or even the principal explanans of one's correct self-ascriptions; and transparent knowledge of it is not a precondition for such ascriptions. An analogy: I know this potato is composed in large part of water without checking first to ensure that it contains any hydrogen. But nothing in that observation about my epistemic status threatens the ontological link between water and hydrogen. Likewise, I know that my present experiences are mine without checking first to ensure that they are linked to a certain body. But that fact does not threaten the bodily criterion, the content of which is metaphysical, not epistemological.

Chapters 4 and 5 concern, respectively, psychological continuity and modal constraints on selves. I lack space here to survey the many arguments Madell gives in these two very interesting chapters, but I will register a couple of brief concerns. First, Madell's attack on Shoemaker's notion of quasi-memory (74) is rather quick, turning first on subjectivity (when what is at issue is ontology) and turning next on claims about Parfit's thesis that personal identity is a matter of degree (when the general friend of quasi-memory need not agree with Parfit's thesis). Second, Madell's attack on the necessity of origin appears yet again to blur problematically the line between epistemology and metaphysics. Madell's objection concerns whether his "sense of identity" depends on knowledge of origin (99). The necessity of origin thesis is neither about senses of identity nor about knowledge.

Moving on, a very interesting stream of discussion that runs through much of the book concerns Cartesian mental substance and its detractors, beginning with Kant. According to Madell, Kant's objection that mentality could be transferred unduly across myriad mental substances like motion among elastic balls suffers from a deep confusion concerning ontology and ideology in Descartes (55-56). While Descartes's ideology distinguishes mental substance from its modes, there is but one unified locus of these concepts in his ontology. The mental is substantival and complete, neither a bare substratum for numerically distinct mental properties nor an incomplete mode like motion. Consequently, Madell urges, Kant's analogy breaks down: there are no bare loci of consciousness or representation that can be transposed or swapped out across time like elastic balls in a chain of movement. The inventory of arguments, claims, and views that Madell goes on to criticize for misinterpreting the Simple View in this way is extensive and wide-ranging.

I will leave it to Descartes scholars to assess Madell's interpretation. However, without having to contest the exegesis, one might well question whether Madell has succeeded in protecting the Simple View from the Kantian worry. I take the Kantian point to be something like the following. If the Simple View is true, then a large collection of distinct, short-lived selves can have, each in turn, experiences that collectively are just like the experiences had by some one self over time, which might well strike one as absurd. There must, the worry goes, be an experientially discernible qualitative difference between a scenario with one self and a scenario with many selves. This is no refutation of the Simple View, to be sure, but it is a substantive worry that antecedently neutral theorists might harbor. And it goes through even if one grants that the Simple View is not committed to bare mental substrata.

To his credit, Madell is not only aware that the Simple View allows for this seemingly worrisome state of affairs, he argues in Chapter 5 that it is not prohibitively worrisome. However, much of his case consists in charging those who raise the worry with misinterpreting the simple view in the way Madell thinks Kant misinterpreted Descartes. But we have just seen that the worry does not turn on imputing to the Simple View a flat-footed commitment to bare mental substrata. The worry is simply that -- even if I lack an explanation as to whether a certain collection of some appropriately related experiences are mine -- I have no good reason to agree with the Simple View that a collection of experiences just like the one in question might well belong to, say, scores of thousands of persons. Indeed, I might well find this result absurd.

Madell's attempted fix is to point out that we already accept analogous conclusions about ordinary material objects (112). An ordinary office printer, for example, may rapidly and frequently be replaced by duplicates without any of us ever noticing. Yet our acknowledging this kind of possibility, Madell urges, does not lead us to deny that the diachronic persistence conditions for (non-branching?) printers and other ordinary material objects are set by spatiotemporal continuity facts.

One might resist Madell's suggested fix in a number of ways, perhaps by insisting on certain special features of persons that make the "frequent replacement" worry stronger for persons than for printers, or perhaps by distinguishing between matter, on the one hand, and objects that satisfy natural and artifact-relevant sortals, on the other (so that the case above involves frequent replacement of quantities of matter but only one printer). But I see the most pressing worry for the Simple View to be that it allows not just numerical difference in selves over time during some continuous set of experiences, but that it allows numerical sameness of self over time across arbitrarily varied experiences in wildly discontinuous spatial locations, for any such collections of experiences may all -- primitively -- be mine, according to the (lack of) constraints set by the Simple View. This worry has no analog from ordinary material objects.

In short, the theorist of personal identity more worried about counting persons than she is about first person subjectivity will find little to recommend the Simple View, even if she is generally quite moved by the puzzling nature of the first person. The Essence of the Self is unlikely to sway the theorist just described. Indeed, Madell himself asserts in the opening chapter that "many people will see grounds for rejecting [the Simple View] outright" (10). He is probably right about that. Nonetheless, his sustained attempt to displace those grounds constitutes a rewarding read.


Thank you to Donovan Wishon for very helpful comments on a draft of this review.

[1] J.M.E. McTaggart (1927) The Nature of Existence, vol. 2. Cambridge: Cambridge University Press; S. Shoemaker (1968) "Self-Reference and Self-Awareness" Journal of Philosophy. 65: 555-67.

[2] D. Chalmers (1996) The Conscious Mind. Oxford: Oxford University Press.

[3] Chalmers (1996), 85

[4] S. Shoemaker and R. Swinburne (1984) Personal Identity. Oxford: Basil Blackwell. p. 104. See also J. Perry (1979) "The Problem of the Essential Indexical" Nous 13: 3-21.

[5] In the passage Madell cites, Shoemaker says explicitly that the working notion of action "here includes the mental activity involved in deliberation and reasoning, as well as bodily action" (1984, 104).