The Ethical Challenges of Human Research: Selected Essays

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Franklin G. Miller, The Ethical Challenges of Human Research: Selected Essays, Oxford University Press, 2012, 352pp., $55.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780199896202.

Reviewed by James Stacey Taylor, The College of New Jersey


Of the three main areas of research in applied ethics -- medical ethics, business ethics, and environmental ethics -- medical ethics has received the most sustained philosophical attention. But not all issues in medical ethics have received the same degree of philosophical scrutiny, and while much attention has been paid to ethical issues that concern the provision of medical care, comparatively little attention has been paid to ethical issues that arise in the course of clinical research. Franklin G. Miller's book is thus a welcome corrective to bioethics' usual focus.

This is a collection of twenty-one essays that Miller co-authored over the course of fifteen years, and one paper (on placebo-controlled trials in psychiatric research) that he wrote alone. (Miller's co-authors include Alan Wertheimer, Steven Joffe, Donald L. Rosenstein, Christine Grady, Howard Brody, Ezekiel J. Emanuel, Stephen E. Straus, David Wendler, John P. Gluck, Jr., Leora C. Swartzman, Evan G. DeRenzo, and Steven D. Pearson.) The volume is divided into four sections. The first concerns a general ethical perspective on protecting human subjects in clinical research. It addresses the question of paternalism in research ethics and two related questions concerning research risks: are there "any clear and cogent principles that define allowable net risks of research"? and, if not, "what considerations are relevant in making judgments about the reasonableness of research risks in light of potential knowledge benefit?" (38). The second section addresses ethical issues in study design, including the ethics of provoking psychiatric symptoms, the ethics of inducing infections, the provision of fake invasive procedures, the provision to patients of placebos while withholding treatment that is known to be effective, the use of deception to generate scientifically valid data, and the use of experimental treatments on cancer patients who have exhausted all other treatment options.

The third section develops a sustained critique of both the conception of clinical trials as being a "scientifically guided, therapeutically orientated" activity "conducted within the context of the physician-patient relationship" (192), and the principle of "clinical equipoise", the view that a randomized trial is only ethical when there is "genuine uncertainty within the medical community as to whether . . . any of the . . . treatment arms are superior" to the others in the trial (199). The fourth and concluding section addresses a range of ethical issues related to informed consent. These include: an examination of the way in which the "therapeutic misconception" (the "tendency of individuals enrolled in clinical trials to confuse the scientific orientation of their research participation with the therapeutic orientation of medical care" [243]) might impair informed consent, the question of whether it is ethical to keep confidential the interim findings of randomized controlled trials, and the ethics of conducting research on medical records without first securing informed consent. The section concludes with the final paper, an insightful one that criticizes the standard view of informed consent as "autonomous authorization", arguing that this view of informed consent should be replaced with a "fair transaction" model of consent.

While the issues that Miller and his co-authors address are wide-ranging, they are also intertwined and connected by his overarching view of both the purpose of clinical research ("to develop knowledge that can lead to an improvement in medical care (and promote public health)" [xvii]) and their views of how this can be achieved while protecting the human subjects involved. As such, while (as Miller acknowledges) the volume lacks the coherence of a monograph, it does offer a systematic view of research ethics, avoiding the pitfall that many anthologies fall into of merely being variations on a philosophical theme.

Of the many views that Miller and his co-authors advance and defend two stand out as being especially important: the view (defended with Rosenstein) that the therapeutic orientation to clinical trials should be rejected, and the development (with Wertheimer) of the "fair transaction" model of informed consent.

As Miller and Rosenstein note, clinical medicine and clinical research differ in fundamental and important respects. The former is intended to provide patients with optimal healthcare, the latter to produce medical knowledge. As such, clinical research involves procedures (such as placebo controls, restricted flexibility of drug dosing, and evaluative biopsies) that are not justified by appeal to the wellbeing of the particular patients upon whom they are performed, but by appeal to the potential value of the knowledge they could lead to. Yet Miller and Rosenstein observe, while these differences have often been noted, their ethical significance has gone largely unappreciated. As a result, "clinical trials continue to be conceived from a therapeutic perspective orientated around the physician-patient relationship" (193).

This conception of clinical trials, they argue, suffers from three ethical problems. First, it encourages the "therapeutic misconception" of the purpose of clinical research, which can compromise persons giving their informed consent to participate in it. Second, it can lead to blurring the purpose of clinical trials and patient care in the minds of investigators, which in turn might obscure conflicts that exist between the scientific pursuit of knowledge and the protection of the human subjects utilized for this. Third, if investigators adopt the view that the research they are engaged in is therapeutic to their subjects they could invite and receive their subjects' trust that their wellbeing will be promoted by the research. This could contribute to a situation in which the research subjects are exploited, agreeing to participate in research that they would not have agreed to had they not trusted the investigators. To counter these ethical problems, Miller and Rosenstein suggest that investigators' relationships with their subjects should be modeled on those that exist between them and healthy volunteers. In such relationships the investigators' relationships with their subjects is solely scientific -- and often also commercial, with investigators paying their subjects for their participation. Adopting this model, they argue -- with routine payment for both healthy and unhealthy research subjects -- would counter the ethical problems associated with the therapeutic conception of research by symbolizing the differences that exist between clinical research and clinical care.

Miller's endorsement of moving clinical research to a more commercial footing -- albeit for symbolic rather than economic reasons -- and his concern with the "therapeutic misconception" are also echoed in his and Wertheimer's development of "the fair transaction" model of informed consent. They develop this model after criticizing the "autonomous authorization" model articulated by Ruth Faden and Tom L. Beauchamp, on which "X acts autonomously only if X acts (1) intentionally, (2) with understanding, and (3) without controlling influence".[1] Miller and Wertheimer charge that in practice the "therapeutic misconception" will compromise persons' ability to consent to becoming research subjects on the "autonomous authorization" (AA) model of informed consent because it would undermine their understanding of what participation in research involves. This shows, they charge, that the "AA model suffers from a one-sided focus on the quality of the subject's consent; specifically, on whether the mental state of consenters counts as an autonomous authorization" (296). More precisely, they charge that this model of informed consent (1) "fails to do justice to the relevance of risk-benefit considerations in shaping the criteria for the validity of consent;" (2) compromises the interests of potential subjects in being allowed to consent to participation when they labor under the therapeutic misconception, even if such participation would be in their interests; (3) denies investigators fair notice of when consent can be considered valid; and (4) threatens the limits on investigator responsibility for ensuring that their subjects understand what their participation involves (296).

Given these perceived problems with the AA model of informed consent, Miller and Wertheimer develop the "Fair Transaction" (FT) model of informed consent. On this model, the "criteria for assessing the validity of consent transactions should be based on fair terms of cooperation for the respective parties that reflect the context of the activity for which consent is given" (300). On this view, in "soliciting and accepting consent, investigators should treat prospective subjects fairly in light of the key values of personal sovereignty . . . and well-being" (300), with investigators being required by fairness to employ more stringent standards to ensure subjects' comprehension when the negative consequences of trial participation could be high.

Miller's (and his co-authors') proposals to move away from the therapeutic orientation to clinical trials and to move to the FT model of informed consent are initially plausible. But, on closer examination, the arguments they present unravel. While Miller and Rosenstein rightly reject the therapeutic view of research participation, it is not clear that one should turn immediately to its symbolic commercialization. Although there is nothing obviously objectionable about paying research subjects, it is not clear that this is the only means that could be used to ensure that investigators and subjects recognize that theirs is primarily a research relationship. One could, perhaps, simply require that subjects be educated better prior to enrolling in clinical research and that it be made clear to them that they are primarily research subjects. Likewise, one could require that investigators be reminded of their relationship with their subjects, by (for example) having the chart of each subject include "Research Subject" next to the subject's name.

Similarly, Miller and Wertheimer's arguments do not fully support replacement of the AA model of informed consent by their own FT models. Most obviously -- and as they acknowledge -- they owe an account of what constitutes "fair" terms of cooperation before their account can be put into practice. This, of course, is not so much an objection as a request for further elucidation of their view. But what is problematic about their model is that it does not seem to be a model of informed consent so much as it is a model of when persons should be concerned about ratifying the consent that they have apparently received. That is, Miller and Wertheimer are not really providing an account of what it is for a person to give consent, as they believe, but an (underdeveloped) account of when "fairness" requires that the consent that has apparently been given be verified as such. But if this is correct, then their (well-placed) objections to the AA model of informed consent and their subsequent development of the FT model will be less helpful in practice than they believe. If we accept the FT model as a rubric to guide us in determining the degree of care we should take in verifying the apparent consent we have been given, then until we have an account of fairness we cannot proceed.  This is because we cannot tell what pains we should take to verify whether we should accept the consent that we have been given as transformative consent, i.e., as consent that will legitimately change the relationship between the potential research subject and the potential investigator to actual subject and actual investigator. And, worse yet, if we accept Miller and Wertheimer's criticisms of the AA model of informed consent, then we do not have a model of consent to work with anyway!

Things might be less bleak than they appear, however. Miller and Wertheimer are correct to note that the weak point of the AA lies in its requirement that a person acts autonomously (and so consents autonomously) only if she does so "with understanding". This is certainly true at a trivial level -- a person must have an understanding of the act she is performing under some intensional description for her to be autonomous, self-directed, with respect to it. But once more robust requirements are instituted for a person to be autonomous with respect to an act she performs things become problematic. A fourteenth-century plague doctor, for example, would not be acting with understanding of the disease he faced when he treated his patients for "foul air", but it would be odd to claim that he thereby lacked autonomy with respect to his actions. (Although one could correctly claim that owing to his medical ignorance his acts were not as instrumentally valuable to him as they might have been.)

Instead of focusing on the mental state of the (would-be) consenter, then, we should follow Miller and Wertheimer's lead and consider the context in which the consent is given. But, rather than introducing a normative element as they do, we should question whether it is the consenter, or another agent, that is the font of the consent. Thus, if a person were manipulated or deceived by another into consenting to participate in research, the consent would not be autonomous, and hence (given certain plausible assumptions about necessary conditions for consent to be transformative) not transformative. If, however, the consenter consented absent interference by another, and did so in accord with a decision-making procedure that he accepted as being appropriate in the situation in which he found himself (a condition that distinguishes autonomous agents from non-autonomous agents), then he would be autonomous with respect to his consent.[2] And once this has been established we can turn to a normative procedure (such as that offered by Miller and Wertheimer) to determine how much effort we should put into ascertaining the degree to which the consent given should be taken to be transformative.

Miller and Wertheimer might respond by observing that while this is a criticism of the details of their view, it does not constitute a rejection of their general approach to the question of when a research subject could be said to have given her transformative consent to participate in a research trial. This is certainly true -- and a similar point could be made with respect to the volume as a whole. That is, while the details of the arguments offered by Miller and his co-authors might sometimes go astray, this does not undermine the plausibility of the general approach that they take to the four sets of questions that they address. There is thus much of value in The Ethical Challenges of Human Research, and it serves as a welcome corrective to the more usual bioethical focus on medical care.

[1] Ruth R. Faden and Tom L. Beauchamp, A History and Theory of Informed Consent (New York: Oxford University Press, 1986), 238. It should be noted that while Faden and Beauchamp believe that protecting patient autonomy is the ethical underpinning of informed consent, what Miller and Wertheimer take to be their model of informed consent is actually their model of what it is for a person to act autonomously.

[2] This view of autonomy is developed and defended in James Stacey Taylor, Practical Autonomy and Bioethics (Routledge, 2005), chapter 1.