The Ethical Project

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Philip Kitcher, The Ethical Project, Harvard University Press, 2011, 422pp., $49.95 (hbk), ISBN 9780674061446.

Reviewed by Ron Mallon, Washington University in St. Louis


Philip Kitcher's The Ethical Project is an ambitious attempt to connect our ethical theories and practices to their natural history in a way that supports (rather than undermines) ethical theorizing and practice. As we have come to expect from Kitcher, whose previous work has engaged (among other topics) creationism (1982), sociobiology (1985), progress in science (1993), and the role of science within a democracy (2001), the book engages big questions with a care and sweep that will make it important for years to come.

What Kitcher calls "the ethical project" is the project of specifying, negotiating, reforming, and enforcing the norms and norm-governed practices that we do or should live by, a project that Kitcher holds to have been continuously pursued since its beginning due to our prehistoric human need to "ameliorate altruism failures" (p. 7). His exploration of this ethical project is divided into three parts.

In the first, Kitcher offers what he calls an "analytical history": a "how possibly" explanation for the evolution of human ethical practices. Kitcher begins with a discussion of human capacities for altruism and the limits of such capacities, and he goes on to suggest that a human capacity for "normative guidance" emerged in response to these limits. His explanation skillfully combines empirically grounded hypotheses and theoretically grounded ideas from evolutionary theory with more speculative ideas about how things might have gone in the emergence and evolution of these capacities and practices. The result is an account that is interesting and plausible.

The second part shifts from the historical to the meta-ethical, and it is here we expect some sleight of hand to occur, for Kitcher aims for nothing less than to use his natural history of the ethical project to specify a meta-ethical position (one he characterizes as "pragmatic naturalism"). What he suggests is that we can understand ethical progress as the successively better fulfillment of the ethical project's original function -- the remedying of altruism failures -- as well as the successively better fulfillment of certain subsidiary functions that emerge in the course of satisfying this original function. Kitcher further proposes that we understand ethical truths as those maxims that "are acquired in progressive transitions" (that is, transitions that better fulfill the functions of the ethical project) and are "retained through an indefinite sequence of progressive transitions" (p. 7).

Kitcher is right that once we have got the idea of functions that can be fulfilled more and less successfully, we have all we need for an objective and naturalistic account of "progress," and that we can further identify persistent elements of successive solutions as "truths." But has a sleight of hand occurred? The idea that we can replace ideas of moral truth and moral progress with the successive approximation of the (naturalistically understood) functions of ethics is a radical idea, and Kitcher is convincing that it is an idea worth pursuing. Nonetheless (as Kitcher himself notes, p. 272), it is an idea that leaves readers asking versions of the Moorean question: is fulfilling the naturalistic functions of our ethical discourse good? Are maxims that persist through successive solutions to the original function true?

The third part of the book takes up normative questions. It begins with an articulation of what normative ethics amounts to within the pragmatic naturalist account (viz. the project of deciding "how to live together in a common world") and what the role of philosophical ethics is (the role of identifying the functions of ethics and using "factual knowledge to find ways in which those functions could be more effectively discharged" (p. 286)). In light of his meta-ethical framework, Kitcher proposes a normative framework of "dynamic consequentialism" (§45), on which we understand our ethical predicament as one of specifying a conception of the good that best discharges the functions of ethics, and of specifying particular norms or rules that promote this good. He goes on to suggest that our present predicament is one in which we have, in the course of trying to satisfy various subsidiary functions that have arisen in the course of the ethical project, sacrificed the original one -- remedying altruism failure -- a failure especially evident in the vast inequalities within and between contemporary nations (§46). Kitcher goes on to offer an account of ethical method consistent with the meta-ethical perspective developed earlier in the book. The book closes with a discussion of more specific consequences of these normative views, and suggestions about where to go from here.

Kitcher's book exhibits a grand sweep, but one that will leave specialists wanting more fine-grained discussion of work in these areas. For example, the first part does not offer very detailed or critical engagement with up-to-the-minute literatures in moral psychology, human evolution, or evolutionary game theory. Nor does the second provide detailed engagement with recent work in meta-ethics. What we get instead is a broad-ranging discussion with a sort of architectural coherence in which the pieces fit together well and reinforce one another. It remains to ask whether there are central support elements whose collapse might threaten large parts of the discussion. Two candidates for such elements are the idea that the original natural function of ethics is "remedying altruism failures" and the idea that the "ethical project" is in fact an ethical project. Both of these elements raise difficult questions.

Begin with the first, and grant that humans are altruistic, that these dispositions are limited, and that humans also have a capacity for normative guidance. Is remedying altruism failures really the original function of our capacity for normative guidance? Various lines of evidence suggest that this is promising. Crucial to many explanations of a range of central and distinctive features of human life -- for example, human adaptability, human intelligence and human culture -- is human cooperation. However, game theoretic models of cooperation show that cooperative actors are exposed to the risks of defections, and evolutionary models, in turn, seem to suggest that unless such defections can be limited, the capacity for cooperation would not evolve and manifest. Addressing this problem has given rise to a vast literature on the "problem of altruism," serving as a background for Kitcher's idea that the origin of human normative practices is in the need for (or at least the advantage in) ameliorating altruism failures, allowing collective behavior (cooperation and coordination) to be sustained over longer times, broader ranges of circumstances, and with more and more people. However, these models tend to be extraordinarily abstract and amount to "how possibly" models of human natural history. Of course, Kitcher himself casts the aim of parts of the first section of his book as supplying a "how possibly" explanation for the emergence of the ethical project (see §10 for the "how possibly" connection of altruism failures to normative guidance), and he is very aware that different parts of his argument offer, and require, different sorts of claim (see especially the end of §2).

But notice that if our normative practices do not actually have their root in remedying altruism failures, then remedying those failures is not the original function of these practices. Does it matter if we have identified the actual original function of the ethical project? Would it be enough for remedying altruism failures to be a merely possible original function for the ethical project? Not always, for the identification of the actual function seems crucial to Kitcher's meta-ethical and normative arguments. Begin by recalling the role we mentioned above for the reality of such a function in grounding conceptions of ethical progress and ethical truth. Of course, Kitcher well recognizes that we can ask even of the actual original function or functions of our ethical practices whether we ought to continue to attempt to satisfy such a function. But, Kitcher notes, recognizing the original, naturalistically understood function of our ethical practices allows the pragmatic naturalist to say that in engaging in the ethical project, we have been and can be responsive to something outside ourselves and our current cultural circumstances, namely satisfaction of this original function (§34, §40).

The identification of the actual original function also gives pragmatic naturalism responses to skeptical meta-ethical positions. For example, the pragmatic naturalist can diagnose in the skeptic "an inability to appreciate how central the ethical project is to human life" and tell him that he "fails to understand how the origin and evolution of ethical practice have framed his life" (p. 273). This identification also has normative implications, as when Kitcher notes that the gaping inequalities of contemporary life are the product of institutions that forfeit the original functions of our ethical practices (§46, p. 295). In each case, Kitcher's later arguments look undercut unless his identification of the original function of our ethical project is true to human natural history. (Kitcher seems aware of this, and in multiple places he simply endorses the stronger claim that "remedying altruism failure is the original function of ethics" (p. 222).)

But consider some other possible original functions that our broad capacity for and practices of normative guidance might serve. Suppose, for example, normative guidance grew out of selection for ways of regulating eating together so as not to disgust those with whom we eat (Kass 1994). Or perhaps normative guidance is adapted originally to regulating our conspecifics to avoid "poisons and parasites" (benefiting ourselves via herd immunity) (Kelly 2011). Or perhaps we came to endorse and debate third-party norms only as a mere byproduct of first-person aversions to action types (Lieberman et al. 2003). Or perhaps moral norms emerged as a byproduct of other mental mechanisms in place of other adaptive reasons (Stich 2006). The point is that reconstructing the actual natural history of humanity is a quite difficult affair, and that it seems that large parts of Kitcher's discussion are hostage to the truth of a particular empirical thesis about it.

Of course, it remains possible that, even if this isn't the original function of our ethical project, we should make our practices more responsive to altruism failures or that ameliorating such failures is essential to many things we value. But merely saying this would be to trade "pragmatic naturalism" for a simple pragmatism -- one that agrees with Kitcher that morality is an invention, but has it that it is a much more recent invention than he suggests.

Turn to the idea of the "ethical project itself." Not only are there are epistemically possible alternatives to the original function of our normative practices, but there are actual alternatives for exactly what normative capacities and practices can satisfy human needs for sustained cooperation -- a fact that Kitcher acknowledges (Ch. 2 and §34) and that a burgeoning body of both empirical and theoretical work is exploring (e.g., Henrich and Henrich 2007, Chudek and Henrich 2011). But the upshot of acknowledging this is that some possible regimes of normative guidance are not recognizably ethical (see Kitcher, §11).

When we put together this underdetermination of satisfiers of the original function with our uncertainty about the original function itself, we begin to get the suggestion of something quite different from an ethical project. For it seems possible (and perhaps even actual) that neither the original function nor the regimes of normative guidance we employ to address altruism failures are in any way distinctively ethical or moral. An alternative picture emerges of a "normative project," one that asks what norms we ought to live by, given all the things we have been doing and all that we want (and here again, there will be better and worse ways of getting these things). This picture fits nicely with Kitcher's own critique of the idea of a "distinctively ethical point of view" (pp. 80ff.), and it also dovetails nicely with recent naturalistic work suggesting that the category of "morality" is itself a cultural invention (e.g., Machery and Mallon 2010, Nado et al. 2009, Stich 2006). But given the meta-ethical and normative implications Kitcher wants to draw, it doesn't seem to be his picture. But it is unclear whether he has grounds to resist it.

There is much more to be said about this rich book, and many nuances in Kitcher's discussion that deserve fuller consideration than I can give them here. Though some difficult questions remain, this book is philosophy of science at its most philosophically ambitious, using a broadly scientific worldview to engage big questions as to how we can make sense of moral reality and moral progress against the broad background of things we know about human natural history and human nature. Working through it offers readers an impressive account that is (in its aspirations at least) a refreshing alternative to the recent, seemingly unrelenting linkage of naturalism with varieties of moral skepticism. I look forward to rereading it, and to thinking and talking about it, for some years to come.[1]


Chudek, M. and Henrich, J. (2011) "Culture-gene coevolution, norm-psychology and the emergence of human prosociality." Trends in Cognitive Sciences. 15(5), 218-226.

Henrich, N. and Henrich, J (2007). Why Humans Cooperate. New York: Oxford University Press.

Kass, L. (1994). The Hungry Soul. New York: The Free Press.

Kelly, D. (2011). Yuck! The Nature and Moral Significance of Disgust. Cambridge, MA: The MIT Press.

Kitcher, P. (1982). Abusing Science: The Case Against Creationism. Cambridge, MA: The MIT Press.

Kitcher, P. (1985). Vaulting Ambition: Sociobiology and the Quest for Human Nature. Cambridge, MA: The MIT Press.

Kitcher, P. (1993). The Advancement of Science, New York: Oxford University Press.

Kitcher, P. (2001). Science, Truth, and Democracy, New York: Oxford University Press.

Lieberman, D., Tooby, J. and Cosmides, L. (2003). "Does morality have a biological basis? An empirical test of the factors governing moral sentiments regarding incest." Proceedings of the Royal Society. London B, 270, 819-826.

Machery, E. and Mallon, R.  (2010). "The Evolution of Morality." The Oxford Handbook of Moral Psychology. J. M. Doris and T. M. P. R. Group. Oxford: Oxford University Press, 3-46.

Nado, J., Kelly, D. and Stich, S. (2009). "Moral Judgment." The Routledge Companion to the Philosophy of Psychology, John Symons and Paco Calvo (eds.). New York: Routledge. 621-633

Stich, S. (2006). "Is Morality an Elegant Machine or a Kludge?Journal of Cognition and Culture. 6, 1 and 2, 181-189.

[1] This review benefitted from helpful comments from and discussion with Kyle Stanford and especially Charlie Kurth.