The Ethics of Abortion: Women's Rights, Human Life, and the Question of Justice

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Christopher Kaczor, The Ethics of Abortion: Women's Rights, Human Life, and the Question of Justice, Routledge, 2011, 246 pp., $39.95 (pbk), ISBN 9780415884693.

Reviewed by Don Marquis, University of Kansas


Christopher Kaczor defends the Catholic view, or what is sometimes known as the substantial identity view, of the wrongness of abortion. This is not a religious view. It is a natural law argument. Its core is the syllogism that because all human beings have a serious right to life and because human fetuses are human beings, human fetuses have a serious right to life. A human being is a biological organism that belongs to our species. Judith Thomson's famous defense of abortion does not succeed. Therefore, abortion is wrong. The minor premise of this syllogism is a true claim in biology. With the exception of the discussion of Thomson's view, the major premise is the locus of philosophical interest.

Although I believe that Kaczor's positive defense of the major premise does not succeed, this book contains much of great value. A major portion of Kaczor's book is devoted to critical discussions of views concerning the right to life that are incompatible with the major premise of the above syllogism. Many of these discussions are of great interest and have great merit. Although some of these analyses can be found elsewhere in the extensive literature on the abortion issue, Kaczor's book contains the most complete, the most penetrating and the most up-to-date set of critiques of the arguments for abortion choice presently available. It is required reading for anyone seriously interested in the abortion issue. It is a good introduction for anyone who wishes to read a serious and thoughtful account of all of the various serious philosophical views that support the right to abortion. It deserves careful study. I certainly would not endorse every single argument in the book. Nevertheless, Kaczor's book contains much good material. I highly recommend it.

Two of Kaczor's analyses are especially important. The first concerns accounts of what it is to be a person found in the writings of Michael Tooley, Peter Singer, and Mary Anne Warren. These accounts are given in psychological terms and are intended to include in the class of persons human beings after the time of infancy and to exclude human beings prior to birth. I have been inclined to take these accounts for granted, but to question the arguments for the claim that one has the right to life if and only if one is now a person in one of these psychological senses. However, Kaczor offers a thoughtful discussion in which he questions whether such accounts of being a person succeed in including everyone in the class of human beings after the time of infancy. The difficulty that Kaczor discusses concerns giving an adequate and non-arbitrary account of the capacity to exhibit psychological traits that, on the one hand, excludes fetuses and, on the other hand, includes all of those individuals past infancy who have the right to life. Kaczor shows that this task is harder than it seems. Kaczor's discussion constitutes yet another serious challenge to all those philosophers who wish to defend abortion choice by appealing to the claim that fetuses are not yet persons.

Also of particular interest and merit is Kaczor's discussion of the dualistic views Tooley and Jeff McMahan have defended at great length in recent years. Both defend the claim that, because we are essentially persons, we are essentially brains capable of thought. This brain essentialism implies that we did not come into existence until the last part of pregnancy. Kaczor draws on the writings of David Hershenov, Eric Olson, and Matthew Liao to construct a critique of this brain essentialist view. Kaczor's analysis of brain essentialism is a forceful critique of the Tooley-McMahan view. Furthermore, it is a nice summary of the best of the recent literature critical of brain essentialism. This book is worth reading just for this incisive account.

Kaczor's book is organized in the following way. Kaczor treats 'is a person' as synonymous with 'has a serious right to life'. Kaczor's book is divided into chapters most of which have titles of the form "Does Personhood Begin at X?" Substitution instances of 'at X' are 'after birth' 'at birth' 'during pregnancy' 'at conception' 'when the product of conception is no longer an embryo'. He also discusses Thomson's famous defense of abortion and "hard cases". A final chapter is concerned with artificial wombs.

Of course, it is not at all surprising that a book on abortion written by an author in the Catholic tradition should have this organization, but it is less than optimal. One problem is that the term 'person' has become fixed in the mind of philosophers familiar with the philosophical pro-choice tradition as having roughly the meaning that Mary Anne Warren famously attributed to it. To adopt another use of 'person' for the architecture of one's book appears to build a bias into one's analysis. The other problem is that much of this book is concerned with critical analyses of the views of others, and the views of others often don't fit well into the categories outlined by Kaczor's chapters. However, these complaints are -- in the final analysis -- matters of presentation only and such matters do not need to get in the way of the pleasure one can receive from reading this fine book.

Kaczor's positive defense of the claim that all human beings have the right to life is weaker than the rest of the book. On the one hand, to those not familiar with the philosophical literature on abortion, this proposition seems an obvious, and widely accepted, moral truth. It is, no doubt, difficult to forego the obvious rhetorical advantage obtained by basing one's view on this widely accepted claim. On the other hand, this claim has been subjected to two major criticisms, both set out clearly by Peter Singer over thirty years ago in Practical Ethics, and both discussed by Kaczor. The first can be called 'the speciesism objection'. 'Human being' is a biological concept. The wrongness of racism and sexism is based on the fact that biological properties have, all by themselves, no moral significance whatsoever. If this is so, then it seems to follow that the biological property of being a member of our species has no moral significance whatsoever, unless we equivocate on some notion like 'truly human'.

Kaczor calls the second criticism 'the over-commitment objection'. The claim that all human beings have a serious right to life seems to imply that a human being who is in an irreversibly unconscious state, such as an anencephalic child or someone who has experienced severe trauma to her brain or is totally brain dead, has a serious right to life. It certainly seems counterintuitive to suppose that it would be as wrong to end the life of such a human being as it would be to end the life of you or me. Indeed, perhaps it is not wrong at all. There is a basis for this intuition. Most of you do not believe that, if you were in such a state, an action or an inaction that would end your life would result in a diminution of your life prospects you would ever care about. Any serious defense of Kaczor's major premise requires dealing with these standard objections. Kaczor tries to deal with them. Is he successful?

Kaczor deals with the speciesism objection by offering a number of arguments. First, he appeals to the argument that since there are no other ethically relevant differences between ourselves and younger humans, and since we have the right to life, all human beings have the right to life. However, such an argument by elimination is hardly a firm foundation for a position that flies in the face of the important value of reproductive choice. After all, how can we be sure that we have surveyed all of the other potentially ethically relevant differences? Second, Kaczor treats the speciesism objection as merely linguistic. However, this suggests only that he has not come to grips with its strongest version. Third, Kaczor argues that the right to life must be based upon endowment, not performance. What people are capable of doing comes in degrees. This is incompatible with our commitment to human equality. Therefore, the right to life must be based on our endowment, on the genetics that we have in common with all other human beings. This, I am afraid, looks a good deal like the earlier argument by elimination that is surely insufficient as a basis for the right to life. Furthermore, one wonders why the right to life cannot be an equal right that one obtains by meeting some performance threshold, just as all students who pass their junior year in high school have the equal right to enroll for their senior year, whether they passed their junior year with flying colors or barely eked out passing grades.

Kaczor's strongest argument appeals to what he describes as the orientation of all human beings toward freedom and reason. The virtue of this move is that it gets our values into the account of the basis for our rights. The trouble with this move is that either this orientation is entirely a matter of the genetics that make us members of the human species or it is not. On the one hand, if it is just a matter of our human genetics, then, perhaps, it may yield the equality of all human beings. The trouble is that some individuals who are genetically enough like us to be counted as humans, such as the irreversibly unconscious, are not capable of freedom and reason. Therefore, the human genetics criterion divorces Kaczor's criterion of the right to life from the fact that as humans we (typically) value freedom and reason. On the other hand, if our orientation toward freedom and reason depends upon factors other than our genetic code, then we can retain a value-based criterion for the right to life, but anencephalic human beings, the severely retarded and severely demented, and those who have suffered the fate of being rendered irreversibly unconscious will lack the right to life. Therefore, it will be false that all humans have the right to life. The claim that our species is defined as the class of rational animals only avoids this problem by a shallow linguistic move. Each human who is irreversibly unconscious is, after all, a member of a species, the typical members of which are rational animals, even if she is not herself a rational animal. This point can be put in the following way. We can distinguish between those who are directly and those who are indirectly rational animals. A successful argument will not rest on obscuring this distinction.

Of course, the difficulty to which I am referring is what Kaczor calls 'the over-commitment objection'. (116-119). If all humans have the right to life, then we seem to be committed to too much. Kaczor's responses to this objection are sketchy at best. He suggests that one might want to hold that "the right to life is an alienable right, or that neocortical death should be defined as death or that human beings in permanent comas have a different right to life than human beings in temporary comas." (119) He concludes that the view that all human beings have the right to life does not necessarily lead to the view that it is wrong to end the lives of those who cannot be characterized directly as rational animals.

This is an almost unbelievably weak response to what Kaczor recognizes is one of the major objections to his positive account of the right to life. It certainly will not persuade those who wonder whether Kaczor's appeal to equality considerations to justify the right to life of all human beings is consistent with the view that the permanently comatose may have a different (read 'lesser') right to life than the rest of us. It will certainly not persuade those who agree with the orthodox Vatican view that not to provide ordinary care, such as food and water, to any human being, no matter how profoundly disabled, is intentionally to end an innocent human life and is, therefore, wrong. It will certainly not persuade anyone who is convinced (as I am) by the arguments of Alan Shewmon that the death of the brain is not sufficient for the death of a human being. It will not persuade anyone who recognizes that the arguments for the neocortical definition of death depend on the doctrine of brain essentialism, a doctrine Kaczor so emphatically rejects.

Even if all of these difficulties survive analysis, it does not follow that abortion is morally permissible. Nevertheless, it does imply that the major premise of the syllogism that Kaczor endorses as the basis for his view should be rejected. Kaczor's weak arguments are not a sufficient basis for overriding the important value of reproductive choice.

Even though I believe that the positive arguments for Kaczor's core syllogism do not survive analysis, I also believe that this book is worth careful study by anyone interested in the ethics of abortion. I think that it is the best book-length critique of the many defenses of abortion choice. Its analyses of defenses of abortion choice that have appeared in the last decade make it especially valuable and interesting.