The Ethics of an Outlaw

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Ivan Segré, Spinoza: The Ethics of an Outlaw, David Broder (tr.), Bloomsbury, 2017, 186pp., $114.00(hbk), ISBN 9781472596437.

Reviewed by Guadalupe González Diéguez, Indiana University Bloomington


Ivan Segré offers an excellent and original engagement with Spinoza's thought that is particularly timely in several respects. The book's English title loses the reference to Spinoza's coat, in contrast to the book's original title, Le manteau de Spinoza. This loss is regrettable in an otherwise excellent translation into English by David Broder. The book opens by tracing the hatred that Spinoza has long evoked, focusing particularly on a set of modern and contemporary Jewish thinkers dubbed by Segré "the bourgeois theorists of the name 'Jew.'" According to some of Spinoza's early biographers, such as Colerus and Bayle, an attempt was made on the life of young Spinoza before his excommunication (herem). He managed to escape, but the knife of the assailant tore his coat, which he kept as a reminder of the hatred provoked by his freethinking (Nadler, 110). The French title reminds the reader of this story, familiar to anyone versed in Spinozist matters. Its disappearance from the English title may well result from an understandable editorial decision, given that English readers in general are far less familiar with Spinozist lore than their Francophone counterparts. But it erases a crucial element: the fact that the ideas of the freethinker, the ethics of the outlaw, were from the get-go opposed by conservative quarters with rough, physical violence -- with an assassination attempt. The translator prefaces his version with a note in which he explains the French title and its meaning, but the fact that the English title doesn't refer to Spinoza's coat eliminates the original title's reference to reactionary violence.

Part One, "The Philosopher, Election, and Hatred. Spinoza and the 'Bourgeois' Theorists," focuses on the extraordinary hatred directed toward Spinoza. The heated reactions to Spinoza's thought among many supposedly enlightened seventeenth-century philosophers are paralleled, according to Segré, in later figures such as Hermann Cohen, Emmanuel Levinas, Benny Lévy, and Jean-Claude Milner, but this time around with a particular modulation: Spinoza is now hated because he is considered a traitor to the "cause of the Jews" (p. 4). Segré chooses to refute in detail Jean-Claude Milner's arguments in his recent Le sage trompeur. Segré regards the book "a textbook case" (p.6) of this trend that considers Spinoza, as Hermann Cohen put it, an "accuser of Judaism in the eyes of the Christian world," (cited, p. 4), a traitor to the Jewish community, and, in its most extreme reading, even as precursor of modern anti-Semitism.

In his book, Milner focuses on a passage in Spinoza's Tractatus Theologico-Politicus (TTP) that has attained celebrity status because in it Spinoza refers, briefly, to the possibility of the reestablishment of a Jewish state. This brief passage, artificially amputated from its context, and subject to very convoluted exegeses, has become a site of contention. Zionist thinkers, eager at the beginning of the twentieth century to count the great philosopher from Amsterdam among their ranks, claimed that in it Spinoza advocated for the reestablishment of a Jewish state (on this, see Schwartz). On the other hand, Milner turns it into a "manifesto" that proclaims Spinoza's program for the disappearance of the name "Jew" and the complete, clean and bloodless obliteration of Judaism through the conversion of all Jews into Islam. Milner interprets Spinoza's brief (and, granted, historically inaccurate) comment on the seamless assimilation of converts of Jewish origin into the Catholic Spanish Empire, and his ironic note on the remarkable attachment of the Jews to circumcision, as coded references to the Ottoman Empire and to the conversion to Islam of the purported Jewish messiah Sabbatai Ṣevi. According to Milner's deciphering of the passage, Spinoza called for the conversion of all Jews to Islam, so that their name would disappear from human memory, while the practice of circumcision would persist, as it is also required of Muslims. As Segré soberly notes: "For any professor of philosophy, this is a fat piece of nonsense: the Amsterdam philosopher's plan was not a matter of converting Jews to Islam, but of converting men to liberty" (p. 20). In this regard, the lack of reference by either Segré or Milner to the excellent work by Albiac, La synagogue vide, is striking. In his book, Albiac discusses in detail the Sabbatian movement in relation to Spinoza, reaching a conclusion similar to Segré's. Rather than making Spinoza a hidden follower of Sabbatai, Albiac describes their tasks as "rigorously inverse" (p. 436). The hatred of Spinoza is conjoined in Milner, from a contemporary perspective, with the specter of the perceived threat of Islam over the State of Israel, as Segré very pertinently notes (p. 43). Spinoza, ever imagined as a figure of abjection, goes from seventeenth-century atheist into contemporary pro-Islam anti-Semite.

However, Segré's book goes well beyond criticism of Milner's work, as he engages with much larger questions, mostly in the second part, "Spinoza's Bible." From a methodological stand-point, the main issue at stake is how to read texts written under conditions that do not guarantee freedom of speech, i.e., the Straussian question of "persecution and the art of writing." How are we to read a text that is "encoded" so as to avoid censorship? To what extent are we allowed to fill in the blanks, to provide an interpretation that corresponds to the hidden intention encrypted in the text? Doesn't Strauss' esoteric method of reading ultimately allow the reader to ascribe virtually any opinion to the writer? Segré proposes a way to escape the nonsense to which a misuse of the esoteric method leads. Interestingly, his suggestion strongly resonates with traditional Jewish exegetic practice: "I propose setting down the following interpretative rule: the implicit meaning does not contradict the explicit meaning; it internalizes it" (p. 13). This is an exegetic rule that accords with the respect granted to the literal meaning (peshat) in Jewish tradition. Thus, the literal and the encoded meanings do not exclude each other, condemning the ignorant multitude to a necessary deception. According to Segré, "an honest art of writing does not have to deceive the ignorant even as 'collateral damage,' for it rests on the idea that there is no ignorance, in the last analysis, other than the passion of ignorance" (p. 14). A literal exegesis that is not necessarily a literalist one, conditioned by the letter, but rather by the understanding of the letter, "the internalization of its explicit meaning" (p. 57) is put forward here.

Equipped with this honest art of interpretation, Segré tackles the crucial issue of the relation between philosophy and revealed Law. Must philosophy remain under the authority of revealed (Jewish) Law, or be raised above the Law (Spinoza)? The philosopher, as free man living under the guidance of reason, is above the Law. On the other hand, there is the man who lives under the Law. Segré makes it clear that Jewish Law sees itself in this regard as applying to all of humanity (not just to the Jews) in light of traditional Jewish discussions of the covenant of Noah. For Spinoza, however, humanity as a whole is included not because of Jewish Law, but simply because of the universal reign of the Law. Spinoza's "unpardonable crime" is that he affirms thinking outside the Law: "From the censors of the TTP in the Holland of the seventeenth century, to the pious men of the twenty-first, one same argument is professed: the essence of wickedness, or impiety, is an ethics unbound from obedience to the Law" (p. 99).

Opposing the two antithetical alternatives of the universal, transcendent Law (dogmatism) and a law merely imposed by the rule of the strongest (skepticism), which are just two sides of the same coin (p. 125), Segré explains Spinoza's ethics as proposing a "reparation" (tikkun) of the original sin, with the purpose of emancipating humans, turning them into autonomous subjects that live guided by their own thought, and not by any law. Segré focuses on Spinoza's interpretation of Genesis, according to which Adam's fall is his abandonment of a life guided by knowledge. (Adam was like a god before eating from the fruit, unaware of the relative notions of good and evil, guided just by true ideas, but after eating from the fruit he lost that divine quality and became a slave-master, imposing his command on Eve). Spinoza, according to Segré, respects the literal meaning of Scripture more than the overwhelming majority of translators of Genesis, who render the verse "Adam became like a god" (after eating the fruit), contravening the Hebrew original, which is clearly in the past tense: "Adam was like a god" (before eating the fruit). This is one example of Segré's "honest art of interpretation" that strives to pay respects to the literal meaning of the text (and whether this really was Spinoza's intention, we may have known for sure had his projected translation of the Pentateuch mentioned by his biographers Kortholt and Colerus reached us).

Segré accomplishes no small feat: he gives a coherent reading of Spinoza in light of Jewish exegetical tradition that does not come from a place of harsh judgment (din), but rather, from a place of love (hesed); in his own terms, making Spinoza "a worker theorist of the name 'Jew'" (p. 61). If it is already difficult to reclaim Spinoza given the current liberal-bourgeois consensus, it is much harder to do so from within the cultural confines of Judaism without falling into the traps of partisan reappropriation (as in the case of Zionist reclamations of Spinoza) and pure vilification, as the case of those called by Segré "bourgeois theorists of the name 'Jew.'" The enormous difficulty of the task is evident, and Segré's engagement constitutes a most needed and timely reparation (tikkun) of Spinoza.


Albiac, Gabriel. La sinagoga vacía. Un estudio de las fuentes marranas del espinosismo. Tecnos, Madrid, 2013 (1st ed. 1987). Translated into French as La synagogue vide. Les sources marranes du spinozisme. PUF, Paris, 1994.

Milner, Jean-Claude. Le sage trompeur. Libres raisonnements sur Spinoza et les juifs. Court traité de lecture I. Verdier, Paris, 2013.

Nadler, Steven. Spinoza: A Life. Cambridge University Press, 1999.

Scholem, Gershom. Sabbatay Ṣevi: The Mystical Messiah, 1626-1676. Princeton University Press, 2016 (1st edition 1973).

Schwartz, Daniel. The First Modern Jew: Spinoza and the History of an Image. Princeton University Press, 2012

Strauss, Leo. Persecution and the Art of Writing. The Free Press, Glencoe, Ill., 1952.