The Ethics of Aquinas

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Pope, Stephen J. (ed.), The Ethics of Aquinas, Georgetown University Press, 2002, 544pp, $39.95 (pbk), ISBN 878408886.

Reviewed by Robert Pasnau, University of Colorado


No other area in contemporary philosophy is connected with its past in the way that ethics is. When it comes to the study of mind, language, or metaphysics, most scholars feel little obligation to look back more than 100 years or so. In ethics, matters are quite different. Aristotle, Hobbes, Kant, and Mill are not just a part of the curriculum – in many ways, these authors constitute the core curriculum. The study of ethics, in large part, just is the study of the history of ethics, and many leading contemporary ethicists are also experts on the history of their subject.

In this light, the case of Thomas Aquinas is puzzling. Though it would be an exaggeration to say that his ethics has been neglected, it certainly has not received the same kind of attention that other areas of his thought receive, such as his metaphysics, theory of soul, or philosophical theology. Moreover, his ethical writings have had very little influence on mainstream contemporary ethics. Although everyone knows of his theory of natural law and his adoption of Aristotle’s virtue theory, one would have to search long and hard at an APA convention to find someone who could explain what Aquinas’s natural law theory actually is, or who could say very much about what is distinctive in his virtue theory.

What makes this all the more puzzling is that Aquinas spent more time on ethics than he did on any other philosophical topic. The whole of the massive secunda pars of the Summa theologiae (ST 2a) is devoted to ethics – some 20 times the amount of space he devotes to the topic of human nature, and perhaps 200 times the space he devotes to proving God’s existence. It is this vast and little-known territory that Stephen Pope takes on in The Ethics of Aquinas. This large and dense volume collects the contributions of 28 philosophers and theologians, each of whom has been asked to write a chapter on some aspect of ST 2a. Many of the contributors are leading scholars in the field, including Leonard Boyle, Servais-Théodore Pinckaers, Bonnie Kent, Jean Porter, and Ludwig Honnefelder, and the volume as a whole makes a useful contribution to the study of Aquinas’s ethics.

The most useful parts of Pope’s anthology are those contributions that set out clearly and succinctly some specific area of Aquinas’s ethics. Pamela Hall’s essay on the old law and the new law (1a2ae 98-108), for instance, is a model of clarity, as is David Gallagher’s discussion of the will and its acts (1a2ae 6-17). In another worthwhile chapter, on vice and sin (1a2ae 71-89), Eileen Sweeney offers a kind of formula for what every chapter ought to attempt: “seeing Aquinas’s reflections on sin [etc.] not as a scholastic legalism but as a complex view in dialogue with major ethical thinkers and confronting major ethical questions” (152a). Unfortunately, not every chapter is so successful. Indeed, in my view only about half of the contributions are sufficiently worthwhile for me to recommend them to someone wanting to understand the particular part of Aquinas’s ethics that they treat.

Moreover, taken as a whole, the book is less than the sum of its parts, inasmuch as the accumulated chapters never provide anything like a big picture of what Aquinas’s ethics is all about. Each chapter proceeds down its own path, with its own ideas about how such an essay should be written. Because of such disparities in approach, there is not a great deal of repetition (as one might fear); there are, however, many gaps in coverage. It is hard to get a clear picture of the relationship between natural law and virtue theory, for instance, or the relationship between the philosophical and the theological virtues. Nothing is said about the unity of the virtues. No one comes even close to considering what Aquinas’s metaethics might be, and only rarely do contributors look at particular cases of “applied” ethics (e.g., homosexuality, suicide, poverty, warfare).

Few will want to read The Ethics of Aquinas cover to cover. It is best used as a reference book, and in this regard it has value. Different contributors seem to have anticipated different sorts of audiences for their chapters, but in general the book will most benefit students of Aquinas who want a quick summary of some aspect of ST 2a. By contrast, philosophers looking to see how Aquinas compares with contemporary discussions of ethics should avoid this book. Virtually none of the contributors makes any effort to connect Aquinas with later developments – not even with authors like Hobbes, Kant, and Mill, let alone with contemporary discussions. Moreover, when a topic like consequentialism is broached, it tends to be treated in caricature, rather than as a serious alternative view. (The book is perhaps more attuned to recent developments in theology, which would not be surprising given that the editor and many of the contributors come from that field.)

Although presumably intended for students, the book is impressively scholarly throughout. Quotations are translated in the main text but always supplied in Latin in the notes. Each chapter contains a lengthy list of “selected further reading,” which specialists should find quite useful. These lists are clearly not geared to students, however, since a majority of the works cited are not in English. (In one chapter, indeed, none of the works cited were in English.) Despite this impressive scholarship, the book is not very in touch with recent developments in the secondary literature. Although John Finnis’s work comes in for brief discussion, his important recent book (Aquinas: Moral, Political, and Legal Theory [Oxford University Press, 1998]) is never discussed, and gets cited on only one reading list. Moreover, not a single author mentions any of the first-rate papers published in the recent anthology on Aquinas’s ethics edited by Scott MacDonald and Eleonore Stump (Aquinas’s Moral Theory: Essays in Honor of Norman Kretzmann [Cornell University Press, 1998]). No doubt, Pope and his contributors have been working on this volume for many years, but there is no reason why the bibliographies, at least, should not be up to date.

The book’s last section is devoted to “the twentieth-century legacy,” but this turns out to be an exercise in the history of Thomism, mostly devoted to authors whose books have been gathering dust for some time, such as Dominic Prümmer, Reginald Garrigou-Lagrange, and Yves Simon. It is hard to see what could justify lengthy discussions of these authors, in a volume that contains nothing on Hobbes, Locke, Kant, Mill, Rawls, Foot, or Anscombe. In his discussion of twentieth-century Thomistic ethics, Clifford Kossel notes in passing that Jacques Maritain was appointed a professor of philosophy at Princeton, and Yves Simon at the University of Chicago. Such developments are hard to imagine today. A Thomist at Princeton?! Yet if we want to understand why that seems so improbable, a good first place to look would be this very book. Judging from its contents, Aquinas scholars are doing their very best to make themselves irrelevant to the outside world.

Finally, before discussing some specific examples, one particular oddity of the book needs to be mentioned. The Summa theologiae consists almost entirely of arguments, one after another, page after page, interrupted only by the occasional citation of an authoritative text or the historical background to a particular problem. The Ethics of Aquinas, so far as I can recall, manages to run through the whole of ST 2a without ever sullying its hands with any one of those arguments. This is baffling. How can so many contributors be so interested in what Aquinas has to say, and at the same time be so utterly neglectful of the arguments that are the backbone of his work? For those who are adverse to argumentation, there are lots of careers to choose from other than philosophy and theology. For that matter, there are a lot of philosophers and theologians out there whose work proceeds without the distraction of careful arguments. Why choose Aquinas, of all people, to study?

This book is too big and diverse to be fairly represented by specific criticisms of specific chapters, but I would not wish to review a book on Aquinas’s ethics without spending at least some time talking about the substance of his views. I will confine myself, though, to a single topic. One of the most complex and confusing parts of Aquinas’s ethics is his treatment of “the goodness and badness of human acts” (1a2ae 18-21). Here he attempts to explain, in a general way, exactly what makes an action bad (or good). Does the badness lie in the interior act of will, or in the external bodily act? Does it lie in the very nature of the act, or in the consequences? Is it one’s intention that matters, or what one actually does? The history of ethics is in large part a story of how philosophers have insisted on highlighting some of these elements to the almost total exclusion of others. It is characteristic of Aquinas’s ethics, and perhaps symptomatic of his lack of influence, that he refuses to choose among these alternatives. Instead, he takes the eminently reasonable view that all of these things matter.

If this seems sensible in principle, in practice it is enormously confusing. In these articles, more than anywhere else I can think of in Aquinas’s work, it is tempting to think that he is not entirely in control of his material. He begins (1a2ae 18.1-4) by giving us four ways in which the goodness (badness) of a human act can be considered:

A. In terms of its genus (simply as an action);
B. In terms of its species (determined by the action’s object)
C. In terms of its accidents (the circumstances surrounding the action);
D. In terms of its end (the agent’s intention).

The first of these can be dropped out of the analysis fairly quickly, because every action, considered simply as an action, is a kind of being, and so a good thing (18.1). After this, however, matters become much more complicated. Aquinas thinks that we can classify actions by species in terms of the object of the action, where the object is not that which the agent intends but “that which the external action concerns” (18.6c). So theft is one species of action, defined by the object taking others’ things, and presumably killing is another, defined by the object taking something’s life. So far, Aquinas is not making a moral claim – he is talking only about the way that actions can be put into what we might call natural kinds. This by itself, however, may look rather dubious: should all kinds of killing be lumped together as a species, for instance, or should we distinguish killing human beings as a separate species? If so, should we count suicide as yet a further species?

It would be nice to be able to say that these details don’t really matter, and that we can distinguish between lower and higher species and genera in whatever ways seem most convenient. It doesn’t seem that Aquinas can say this, however, because – having set out this claim about the natural kinds of actions – he proceeds to claim (18.2) that a necessary condition for an action’s goodness is that it be good (or at least not bad) in species. This condition will be absolutely meaningless, though, unless we have some clear way of determining the species of an action. Is it, for instance, killing, or killing humans, or suicide? Aquinas doesn’t think that the first or second are intrinsically wrong, but he does think the third is intrinsically wrong. So the theory crucially depends on having a clear sense of what determines the natural kind of a given action.

In his chapter on this material, Daniel Westberg sloshes through these issues, aware that large ethical questions are at stake but unable himself to bring this material under any sort of control. Aquinas’s most basic principle, through these articles, is that “an action is not good simpliciter unless all the goodnesses concur” (18.4 ad 3; cf. 20.2c) – that is, unless it is good in species, in circumstances, and in end. Westberg doesn’t even mention this principle, and says quite a few things that are inconsistent with it. He takes seriously, for instance, the suggestion of some recent moral theologians that no actions are intrinsically bad, independently of intentions and circumstances. Yet this claim cannot be Aquinas’s view, no matter how it might be attenuated, because Aquinas insists that (B) above functions independently as a moral criterion, apart from (C) and (D).

I’ve already suggested that Aquinas faces considerable problems in trying to separate (B) from (C) and (D). Why, for instance, should taking another’s things be part of the essence of an action, rather than an accidental circumstance? Obviously, this is a detail that makes a moral difference. But Aquinas thinks that accidental circumstances can matter to the moral species of an action – so moral salience gives us no reason to draw distinctions between the natural species of actions. (Confusingly, Aquinas uses ’species’ to refer to both the natural and the moral species of an action.) However these issues are to be handled, it seems to me that Westberg goes too far in introducing elements of (C) and (D) into (B). He remarks that “intention cannot be separated from object” (96a), and “a particular action does not have its moral evaluation until it has been evaluated with the circumstances recognized and the intentions understood” (96a). It is right, of course, that an action cannot be fully evaluated without taking circumstances and intentions into account. But Westberg means something more, that an action has no moral status independently of circumstances and intentions. As he puts it, “the object of an action cannot serve independently as a datum for moral evaluation” (96a). This runs precisely contrary to Aquinas’s project. The whole point of his analysis in 1a2ae Q18 is to isolate the action itself, in abstraction from the surrounding circumstances and intentions, because he insists that the action in isolation is morally significant.

Westberg’s line of argument leaves him with the result that no actions, in themselves, are inherently good or bad. He tries to resist this conclusion, by appealing to action descriptions that, as he puts it, “have an implied intention” (96b). So ’murder’ and ’torture’ and ’sexual harassment’ describe actions that are intrinsically bad, but only because these terms imply intentions and circumstances that make the action bad. It remains true that the action itself is morally neutral. Now, certainly, there are cases where this seems like the right result. Aquinas himself, moreover, expressly denies that all actions, just in virtue of their natural kind, must be either good or bad – some actions, he says, can be morally neutral in kind (18.8). But he does not think that all actions are intrinsically neutral, and in this article his example is theft. Perhaps Westberg wants to resist this result because it seems so obviously wrong. Any freshman, after all, will be able to think of circumstances and intentions in light of which we would be inclined to excuse the act of theft. Yet Aquinas’s point is surely not that, all things considered, one should never steal, no matter what the circumstances. His point is much more reasonable, that no act of theft can be entirely a good thing, no matter what one’s circumstances and intentions, because theft is intrinsically bad. Thus he says, as quoted already, “an action is not good simpliciter unless all the goodnesses concur” (18.4 ad 3).

Here, as in so many other places, it would be easier to understand Aquinas if he were to use more examples. In their absence, it is hard to know what actions other than theft should be counted as intrinsically bad. One might suppose that killing would be a good candidate, but evidently it is not. According to Aquinas,

it is possible for an act that is one in terms of its natural species to be directed at different ends of will. For instance, killing a human being, which in terms of its natural species is the same, can be directed as to an end toward the preservation of justice and the satisfaction of anger. Because of this, these will be different acts in terms of their moral species, because in one way it will be a virtuous act and in the other way it will be a vicious act (1a2ae 1.3 ad 3).

This passage, when combined with what we have just discussed, entails that killing is a morally neutral act. If it were intrinsically bad, then while a good end such as preserving justice might mitigate the badness of the overall action, there would be no end that could make killing a positively virtuous act.

Martin Rhonheimer, in his valuable discussion of “sins against justice” (2a2ae 59-78), considers this very passage. He shows how, for Aquinas, what is intrinsically wrong is for a private person to kill another person (297a) – thereby leaving room for the death penalty and warfare, both of which Aquinas thought morally permissible in principle. In order to accommodate this result within the framework we have been considering, Rhonheimer proposes that a private person’s killing another person be considered a distinct species of action from what an executioner or a soldier does, or from killing in self-defense. If we can get this result, then we can include a private person’s killing along with theft on our list of actions wrong in terms of their species – that is, wrong in terms of (B) above.

Yet how can we get this result? Isn’t it just obvious that, in terms of the external act itself, it’s all just killing? Like Westberg, Rhonheimer proposes appealing to intentions. He remarks, “human actions and their moral identity can never be defined on the level of a purely ’physical’ occurrence of an act. It always requires an initial, basic, intentional content, a basic intentionality” (297b). This immediately looks more promising than Westberg’s approach, because it appeals to intention in only a limited way, as that which is the immediate object of an intentional action. Rhonheimer is surely right that it makes no sense to talk about the object of an action without taking into account the agent’s immediate intentions. This still leaves the agent’s remote intentions as a distinct category of evaluation – category (D) on the above scheme. Yet though this looks attractive in principle, the results are rather dubious in practice. Rhonheimer proposes that killing in self-defense is not even killing, because “the killing, considered in terms of its intention, is a secondary result, occurring beside the intention (praeter intentionem)” (297a). Something similar is true for the soldier and the executioner: the executioner wills that justice be done (294b); the soldier “does not will the death of the attacker, but only to render him harmless” (296b). With these results in hand, Rhonheimer concludes, “one never ought to want the death of a person, either as an intended end or as a means chosen for an end” (297a). This species of action is always, intrinsically wrong.

That’s an impressive result, but to me it seems based on sophistry. I can understand the idea that what the executioner really, ultimately wants is justice, and that what the soldier really, ultimately wants is a just peace. Yet what both are doing, quite intentionally and deliberately, is killing people. The executioner may take no pleasure in his job, but he certainly knows what he is doing, and intends to do it. Of course, his actions may be justified by their consequences, or by the ultimate ends being aimed at. But then we would once again be conflating the very things that Aquinas wants us to distinguish. I myself am far from clear about how Aquinas’s account is to be applied to specific cases, but I do not feel that either Westberg or Rhonheimer tells a coherent story.1


1. I owe thanks to Theresa Weynand for many stimulating discussions of this material.