The Ethics of Armed Conflict: A Cosmopolitan Just War Theory

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John W. Lango, The Ethics of Armed Conflict: A Cosmopolitan Just War Theory, Edinburgh University Press, 2014, 246pp., $120.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780748645756.

Reviewed by Peter Tramel, Fort Hays State University


John W. Lango advances and defends a new cosmopolitan just war theory. It is cosmopolitan because it dispenses with the traditional importance of sovereignty in just war theory. As he puts it, his theory is not "state-centric."

Lango argues that in the ideal case, the U.N. Security Council, not a state or collection of states, would be the authority for a just war (i.e., on the just side of a war in which one side fights justly). However, the conditions for being the authority for a just war can be met in theory, at least, by any collection of persons capable of military action, without any necessary reference to whether they are a sovereign state, or even very like a sovereign state. Also, he argues that stopping grave violations of human rights is the only just goal of military action. So sovereignty is without necessary importance to either possessing the authority to make just war or to the goals of just war. That is not to say, however, that it is not often strongly relevant.

His approach to just war theory is novel and fascinating, and his articulation and defense of it in this book will interest every just war theorist, plus many political philosophers and people with a philosophical interest in political science and international law.

This is a book of theory. Those interested in the final application of the theory will be disappointed. Although he considers many examples, especially from the recent conflicts in Libya, Sudan, and South Sudan, Lango rarely takes positions on which military actions were, or would have been just or unjust. His concern is to articulate dialectically a view of the methods and principles that should inform decisions about such matters, and he tends to demur about final applications, saying only that about them there can be "principled disagreement." Thus it is never clear just how restrictive or permissive this theory really is, although it seems clearly more restrictive in most respects than Michael Walzer's famous theory.

Just war theories tend to consist of lists of necessary and jointly sufficient conditions for making war justly. Lango's list is: just cause, last resort, noncombatant immunity, and proportionality. Compared to traditional just war theories, this list is surprising both for its brevity and its lack of a strong distinction between Jus ad Bellum and Jus in Bello conditions; that is, conditions for justice in choosing to make war and conditions for justice in conducting the war. There is other recent precedent for rejecting the traditional importance of that distinction, most notably in the work of Jeff McMahan. However, Lango arrives at his rejection of it by means quite independent of McMahan's. McMahan attacks the traditional grounds for the distinction, which depend on the idea that soldiers are not morally responsible for doing the bidding of their states. Lango never grants states enough moral importance to get the traditional view started. If being a state has no necessary importance to whether one's war is just, then fighting on behalf of the decisions of a state has no special moral importance either.

Lango derives the first three of his four conditions for just war from a discussion of the 2004 report of the U.N. High-level Panel on Threats, Challenges and Change. To some extent this is a convenient foil for his more philosophical work; but it stands for more than that in his presentation, since on his cosmopolitan view it would be best if the U.N. Security Council was the authority for a just war. That is because he conceives just war in terms of human security and not in terms of the rights of states. He is aware of the many problems that tend to keep the U.N. from filling this role well at present; but ideally it would be the best authority on human security. Also, it would be the best forum to work towards a fair distribution of the burdens of human security: the blood and treasure required to put down grave threats to human rights.

Before Lango articulates his four conditions in detail, he articulates some relevant positions in moral theory and action theory. Most importantly, in moral theory he is thoroughly committed to deontology and methodological coherentism. The kind of deontological view he favors is Rossian: the goal is to find the right mid-level generalizations about our prima facie duties. In approaching just war theory with this kind of moral theory, he follows James Childress. His coherentist approach to method in ethics is a matter of constant revision at all levels as we dialectically broaden investigation. It also includes coherentism about definitions. We may revise definitions of key terms, such as "combatant," and "military action," as we find them to be too imprecise for dialectical progress.

In action theory Lango is an individualist in the sense that he does not give space or weight to any relevant sort of collective intentionality. Or we might say that he is relevantly a reductionist about collective intentionality: he does not see it as more than the sum of the individual actions that are its parts, at least not in any way that concerns just war theory. His views on action theory necessarily connect means and ends so that, for instance, intending just goals in war requires intending just means. Thus Jus ad Bellum (justice/justification in going to war) is not possible without just intentions regarding Jus in Bello (just means, or conduct in war), which is an important departure from traditional just war theory. This is one of the main reasons his theory can get away with so few conditions for just war and still be highly restrictive concerning both cause and conduct. It also matters to his attempt to conceive his proportionality condition as a deontological principle.

Lango develops each of his four core conditions for just war through dialectical discussions of relevant prima facie duties. The first condition, just cause, turns out to depend on the justice of the goals, and derivatively the seriousness of the threat, the (epistemic) clarity of the threat, and the correlativity of the means of accomplishing the goals. The goal must be "preventing sufficiently grave violations of basic human rights" (114). The correlativity requirement is particularly novel and important to his theory as a whole. It is not a requirement that military actions be correlated in quantity according to the seriousness of the threat; it is a requirement that they be correlated in kind according to the nature of the threat.

It is remarkable that Lango's second core condition, last resort, appears in such a short list of conditions. Other theorists with much longer lists of conditions have rejected a last resort condition, most notably Walzer, mainly because they think it is a recipe for unnecessary and dangerous appeasement. There are almost always options short of military action that we may try, until it is too late and enemies of human rights have accomplished their unjust goals or, at least, have grown so powerful that thwarting them will be a much bloodier affair than it would have been if we had acted sooner. He argues that this ignores that a last resort condition should have a reasonableness requirement. Given the seriousness of what it means to use military force, which typically includes violating human rights ourselves (even if we are the just side in a just war), for instance in killing noncombatants, we must exhaust reasonable options short of military action before resorting to military action. Of course options that have little chance of success and options that permit aggression to advance or become more difficult to thwart will tend to fail the reasonableness test. To determine reasonableness, he argues for a graduated list of more and less serious options short of military action and more and less serious kinds of military action, understood in terms of increasingly stringent prima facie duties according to the importance of the human rights we must violate.

Concerning his third condition, noncombatant immunity, it is especially interesting that Lango dispenses with the traditional use of the doctrine of double effect, in favor of a view on which there are increasingly stringent (difficult to override) prima facie duties not to knowingly put noncombatants at serious risk, not to knowingly kill noncombatants, not to intentionally put noncombatants at serious risk, and not to intentionally kill noncombatants. On his view of action theory, it is more difficult to knowingly kill combatants without intending to kill them than on the traditional view. Also, putting noncombatants at serious risk of injury or death is much more difficult to justify on Lango's view than on the traditional view. He says little about the distinction between combatants and noncombatants, other than that babies are paradigmatically noncombatants and that the burden of proof in every case is in favor of noncombatancy; we must regard people as noncombatants unless we can prove otherwise.

The most remarkable thing about his fourth core condition, proportionality, is that he conceives it deontologically. A proportionality requirement is a feature in almost every just war theory; but most theorists conceive it as a requirement for consequences: the good consequences of the military action must outweigh the bad consequences of it. He conceives it deontologically, instead, in terms of the stringency of the relevant duties. Just military action is proportional in the kinds of wrongs it requires to the kinds of wrongs it seeks to prevent. These are partly, but not ultimately, understood in terms of their consequences.

The final chapter, "All Things Considered," is by far the most informative about Lango's view. His four core conditions for just war are co-equal. Each is as important as the others, and each holds even for people who violate the others: the more of them they violate, the worse their actions. They are conjointly sufficient for just war, and they can be most easily met by the U.N. Security Council (conceived according to the U.N. Charter, not in terms of the present real world). They are "core" because all other conditions for just war follow from them, when we understand them correctly. The foremost dichotomy, or dilemma, of just war is facing conflicts between our duties to protect persons from grievous violations of their human rights and our duties not to perpetrate grievous violations of peoples' human rights. Lango thinks that in this book he gives us the right recipe for deliberating about this, and all relevant subsidiary decisions.

Lango's book is a well-written, important, unique contribution to just war theory, with many more merits than any brief review can consider. It rewards patience on the part of readers who would like a more linear and practically committed presentation.