The Ethics of Capitalism: An Introduction

The Ethics Of Capitalism

Daniel Halliday and John Thrasher, The Ethics of Capitalism: An Introduction, Oxford University Press, 2020, 288pp., $99.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780190096205.

Reviewed by Marco Meyer, University of Hamburg


When teaching seminars on political philosophy, I have sometimes found a fundamental disconnect between my teaching and the expectations of my students. My courses are about tax justice, climate change mitigation, or ethics in finance. Yet some of my students are not convinced that addressing injustices in these areas within a capitalist system can ever amount to much. Is capitalism so deeply rotten, they wonder, that tweaking it misses the bigger picture?

Daniel Halliday and John Thrasher's book addresses this question head on. The authors have done a great service to teachers of political philosophy and political economy by writing an accessible introduction to political economy from a philosophical perspective. They focus on the question whether capitalism can have moral foundations. They marshal the debates in the golden age of political economy as well as contemporary contributions so that students can make up their minds.

What I like best about the book is that it teaches students to look at ideas in the context of economic conditions. For instance, chapter 2 discusses the history of inheritance taxes. From the perspective of Rawlsian egalitarianism, say, the feudalist practice of passing down large family estates to a single offspring undivided seems particularly objectionable. Not only is wealth perpetuated in the hands of a few families. In addition, offspring of these privileged families are treated inequitably. Yet the authors revisit Adam Smith's argument that this practice may have played an important role in establishing a balance of power between the king and the aristocracy. The point is not to justify primogeniture, but rather to analyze economic institutions in the context of economic and political conditions. This is a valuable corrective to ideal theorizing in political philosophy.

Another great strength of the book is to discourage students from thinking about economic systems on a one-dimensional scale from socialism to capitalism. In chapter 1, the authors propose the "Political Economy Triangle," situating economic systems between the three poles of capitalism, socialism, and feudalism. Seen this way, an important commonality between capitalism and socialism emerges: the lack of explicit legal and social distinctions of rank. Chapters 2 and 3 show that classical political economists were committed to status equality. In their view, its ability to establish status equality was an important reason in favor of capitalism. Yet many of the injustices of our time, including growing inequality, concern the erosion of status equality. The Political Economy Triangle opens up the question of whether these ills are due to too much capitalism or due to feudalism creeping back in.

The Political Economy Triangle also encourages students to think about economic systems as mixed systems, situated within the triangle. The authors emphasize the range of possibilities for organizing the economy that fall in between the extremes of capitalism, socialism, and feudalism. Rather than framing the choice as one between competing economic paradigms, the book encourages students to think about the right mix of economic institutions.

Chapters 4 and 5 address markets and private property, the two distinguishing characteristics of capitalism and socialism. Chapter 4 nicely balances a discussion of the power of markets in solving information problems and illustrating the many ways in which they can fail. Chapter 5 introduces utopian socialism, Marxism, market socialism and ethical socialism and discusses the moral case in favor as well as against, in light of historical experience.

Taken together, the first five chapters send the powerful message that designing good economic institutions is hard work. Pure forms of capitalism or socialism are unlikely to be satisfying from an ethical perspective. This prepares students to dive into concrete injustices that are often attributed to capitalism in the remainder of the book.

Chapter 6 looks at labor market justice. It covers a discussion of the concept of exploitation and analyses recent trends like the rise in executive pay and labor market polarization.

Chapter 7 discusses the welfare state and leading proposals for dealing with the fact that labor markets confer rewards unequally, including universal basic income, property-owning democracy, and meritocracy.

Chapter 8 turns to trade across borders and its connections to problems of global justice. The chapter covers a treatment of classic economists' enthusiasm for global trade grounded in the notion of comparative advantage, as well as a discussion of contemporary economic nationalism.

Chapters 9 to 12 discuss ethical issues in specific markets. Chapter 9 focuses on dysfunctionalities arising in markets for positional goods. Chapter 10 discusses automation and its impact on the labor market. Chapter 11 focuses on the impact of market activity on the environment. Chapter 12 discusses the moral limits of markets, with an emphasis on commodification in markets for organs and sex work.

What is missing? There is no discussion of finance and money. As a result, the book does not provide much of a starting point to discuss gripes with capitalism connected to the financial crisis of 2008/9, the explosion of sovereign debt and household debt, or alternative monetary policy such as quantitative easing.

Another topic that I dearly miss is tax justice. Students will be curious how to think about the revelations of the Panama papers and other leaks. Issues in the taxation of multinational companies that have received much attention in political philosophy.

While automation is covered in chapter 10, the book has little to say about some of the challenges with regulating big tech. What is missing is a discussion of the history of antitrust law and proposals to reform it.

Finally, one might also have wished for a more extensive treatment of arguments by Piketty and others to the effect that capitalism has inherent feudalist tendencies.

Luckily the authors are aware of these gaps and have already started producing bonus chapters on the website accompanying the book.

What is not to like? The authors made the prudent choice not to get bogged down in discussion about the definition of capitalism and socialism. The downside of this approach is that students may struggle to articulate a working definition of capitalism and socialism to guide their thinking.

At times, bringing in more data and statistics would have been helpful. For instance, in discussing the welfare state, I would find it tremendously helpful to build intuitions for the size of the welfare state and of its different components. Welfare states differ not only in size. In some countries, households across the income distribution receive welfare state benefits, such as child support. In others, it is almost exclusively households at the bottom of the income distribution that receive benefits. Even if more affluent households make the same net contribution in both scenarios, whether they receive some benefits makes a big difference for whether the welfare state is perceivedĀ as handing out benefits to the poor only or to all. In general, the book gives little guidance on how to find good social science on the economic institutions it discusses.

The authors say in the Preface for Students that they intend the book to be a "gateway drug," to make students hungry for more scholarship in political economy. I cannot wait to teach a course based on the book, because I expect that it will work. The book is written in an accessible and engaging style that makes it particularly suitable for undergraduates. The tone they strike is that of a trusted friend that helps you make up your mind, rather than that of the preacher or ideologue. The Further Reading sections at the end of each chapter capture essential classics and are up to date with some of the best research in the area, providing a good starting point for developing extended essays.

What's perhaps more exciting about the book is that it meets students where many of them are: deeply skeptical of the moral underpinnings of capitalism. It takes them on a journey that opens the door to current debates in political economy.