The Ethics of Care: Personal, Political, Global

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Virginia Held, The Ethics of Care: Personal, Political, Global, Oxford University Press, 2006, 211pp, $45.00 (hbk), ISBN 0195180992.

Reviewed by Carla Bagnoli, University of Wisconsin/Milwaukee


In The Ethics of Care, Virginia Held offers a detailed account of the ethics of care, its features and potential as a novel normative theory. The first part of the book is devoted to the definition of care ethics as a distinct theoretical approach that represents an alternative to moral theories such as Kantian ethics and utilitarianism. In contrast to these moral theories, Held argues that the ethics of care centers on personal relations and communal ties. While acknowledging the feminist roots of care ethics, Held defends it as an independent moral framework, whose broader agenda is distinguished from the feminist agenda and also from virtue-ethics. The second part of the book illustrates the import of this view on social and political matters. Held argues that the ethics of care is more promising than Kantian ethics or utilitarianism because of its central values, and the ways in which it constrains markets. Most importantly, Held raises some concerns about the limits of rights-based political discourse, and proposes that we focus on care in order to overcome such limits. Finally, she suggests that the ethics of care has a larger significance for global issues insofar as it offers an alternative characterization of international civility.

Held's account of the ethics of care starts with a list of five defining features. First, "the focus of the ethics of care is on the compelling moral salience of attending to and meeting the needs of the particular others for whom we take responsibility" (10). Second, from an epistemological perspective the ethics of care values emotions, and appreciates emotions and relational capabilities that enable morally concerned persons in actual interpersonal contexts to understand what would be best. Third, "the ethics of care rejects the view of the dominant moral theories that the more abstract the reasoning about a moral problem, the better because the more likely [to?] avoid bias and arbitrariness, the more nearly to achieve impartiality. The ethics of care respects rather than removes itself from the claims of particular others with whom we share actual relationships" (11). Fourth, the ethics of care proposes a novel conceptualization of the distinction between private and public and of their respective importance. Finally, the ethics of care adopts a relational conception of persons, which is in stark contrast to Liberal individualism.

These five features are supposed to define the ethics of care and qualify it as a better alternative to other 'dominant' theoretical approaches. But it is hard to see how. Focus on particular others is a characteristic concern of several ethical theories, including Kantian ethics. Whether Kantian ethics is well-equipped to address this concern crucially depends on how we frame the requirement of universality and impartiality. This same requirement is at stake when we evaluate the epistemological and normative contribution of emotions. For virtue-ethics epistemology, emotions are modes of discernment. In Kantian and Utilitarian ethics their role is typically confined to motivation, but it is nonetheless a rather important role. In some contemporary versions of these latter theories, emotions contribute to morality to the extent that they are not mere interferences and do not clash with the requirement of impartiality. Hence, to assess the comparative merits of the moral theories available, it is important that we understand what the requirement of impartiality actually demands.

When Held spells out the third defining feature of care ethics, she appears to attack several overlapping claims. Her polemics is directed against (i) an abstract decision procedure in ethics, (ii) the normative requirement of impartiality, (iii) the requirement of impersonality, and/or (iv) the priority of universal and general rules. Insofar it rejects the claim that ethical theory requires a complete rational decision procedure, the ethics of care finds more supporters than Held anticipates, as very few philosophers agree that ethical theory is designed to offer a complete decision procedure, and there is ample discussion about the consequences of completeness. Whether moral reasoning takes the form of a procedure or not, it requires some kind of abstraction. The issue is whether the kind of abstraction theories of moral reasoning require is conducive to moral understanding. This is certainly a deep and interesting philosophical question. Held seems to say that dominant theories deploy a kind of abstraction that is detrimental to moral understanding because it requires the denial of moral partialities. But even when abstraction is a warrant to impartiality, it does not demand that we dismiss personal relations, that we disregard particular attachments, or that we fail to attend to the needs of our particular others, as Held argues. A concern for impartiality is not equivalent to the demand for impersonality. There are cases where to grant fair treatment one must apply both the requirement of impartiality and impersonality; but this is no argument for their equivalence. More importantly, neither directly follows from the alleged abstractness of moral reasoning, and the demands of either are generally specified according to specific contexts. (For example, the requirement of impartiality imposes different demands on us in the domain of duties of rights and in the domain of duties of virtues, respectively.) As a requirement on justification, impartiality is not trivial because it imposes that differential treatment be justified on the basis of a relevant difference. But as a substantive requirement, it actually demands little, and it certainly does not demand that we ignore our beloved ones. Hence, it is hard to see exactly on which basis the ethics of care opposes impartialist moral theories. A similar concern arises as we consider the fourth feature, that is, the re-conceptualization of the distinction between the private and the public. The fifth defining feature of the ethics of care concerns the conception of persons and requires a more careful examination.

The claim is that persons are constitutively (and not only causally or developmentally) relational. Because of this basic claim, the ethics of care is certainly hospitable to the relatedness of persons, but does it represent the best theoretical framework to account for it? It is difficult to adequately judge the real promise of the ethics of care as defended by Held particularly because she does not take very seriously her (alleged) opponents. She claims that such "dominant moral theories as utilitarianism and Kantian ethics are built on the liberal model of social relations between strangers" (80). It is disputable that the liberal model of social relations takes persons to be "strangers", but let's take it for granted for the sake of the argument. In the face of recent debates, it is hard to agree with Held that this is the model on which Kantian ethics is built. Christine Korsgaard has extensively argued for the constitutive role of personal relations, and investigated the dimension of reciprocity. Barbara Herman has shown that the apparent conflict between impartiality and partiality is generated by a misunderstanding of the requirements of both. Onora O'Neill has opposed the divergence between justice and care, and called attention to the implications of abstraction and idealization. Several Kantian philosophers have insisted on the moral relevance of emotions and the intimate union of love and respect, and have made room for care and trust. Perhaps more importantly, in the last two decades there has been genuine philosophical progress regarding the role of principles for action, and the related claim that autonomy is tantamount to principled agency. It is thus fair to say that Kantians appear to share the very same concerns for the interdependence and relatedness of persons that are endorsed by the ethics of care. Thus, we can acknowledge that critics of Liberalism have succeeded in furthering the philosophical debate on these issues, and have significantly helped to refine the conceptions of autonomy. But there remains the question whether the ethics of care challenges Kantian ethics in a way that requires a change in paradigm (92), particularly because Kantians forcefully deny that universal principles endanger personal relations, or that their involvement in caring relations represents a loss in autonomy (48). The question, then, is which theory fares better in addressing such issues as our interdependence or relatedness. My worry is that Held's discussion does not help us answer this question because she does not confront recent developments in moral theory: Korsgaard does not appear in her bibliography, Herman is only cited, Stephen Darwall's most systematic proposal of integration of care and respect is quickly dismissed as suggesting a mere juxtaposition of the two concepts (16). This lack of dialogue is unfortunate because it deprives the reader of the grounds for an adequate assessment of both care ethics and Kantian ethics. But it also significantly weakens Held's own argument against Liberalism in Chapters 5 and 6, and in the second part of the book, to the extent that it represents Liberalism as being based on assumptions that Kantian liberals openly reject or do not need to accept.

Contrary to some other supporters of care ethics, Held does not intend to replace justice with care. How exactly she sees them to be integrated, however, remains highly problematic. At times Held suggests that they pertain to different domains, and that they should be allowed priority in their respective spheres of competence (17). At other times, she claims that care may "provide the wider and deeper ethics within which justice should be sought" (17), questions the priority of justice (21, 79), and argues for the priority of care (133). The alleged priority of care is advocated as both a normative and empirical claim, and it is seen to work as the 'presumption' that caring relations are characterized by values such as trust and mutual consideration (133-135). But then Held admits that "the ethics of care may not itself provide adequate theoretical resources for dealing with issues of justice" (17). This uncertainty in relating justice and care and their domains of competence reveals a tension between, on the one hand, the claim that the ethics of care may be accorded priority or at least offer a wider normative network for justice and rights-based discourse, and, on the other hand, the less ambitious claim that they each have their own niche. This calls for a more precise definition of both concepts. Held treats care as both a practice and a value (29-43), and this provisional definition works well as Held tries to draw attention to personal caring relations. While this is an interesting starting point for rethinking the domain of justice, it is hard to figure out how it generates a wider theoretical framework. On the one hand, to treat care as a practice may be too demanding because it requires that the agent be personally engaged in, responsive and attentive to an unsustainable web of interactive relations. On the other hand, if care is treated as a background value that should inform personal relations, it can be accommodated within impartialist moral theories.

The need for a neat definition of the concept of care and its distinctive domain of competence becomes particularly urgent as Held accounts for social issues in the second part of the book. In Chapter 9, Held rehearses the feminist argument for the re-conceptualization of rights. I think she is quite correct that the traditional language of rights may not be the best way to fully account for personal relations. This criticism may be welcomed as the challenging but constructive suggestion that we reformulate the language of rights, as Martha Minow has shown, but it does not necessitate any drastic change in paradigm, nor does it seem to differ in any relevant way from the feminist critique of rights-based discourse. A similar reaction is elicited by Held's approach to global issues in Chapter 9, where she heavily relies on the feminist critique of gendered international political discourse and opposes the liberal approach for its exclusive focus on justice and freedom from interference. The ethics of care is seen to have a distinctive import because it is well equipped to understand cultural and social ties; thus, it gives priority to "positive involvement with others and fosters social bonds and cooperation" (157). But this remark hardly amounts to an argument for care ethics.

In Chapter 7, Held deals with the moral limits of the market, and her argument here is especially interesting and thought-provoking. She draws attention to caring labor, and shows that it escapes in many ways the traditional categories that are appropriate for the market. This is because labor markets as traditionally understood are fundamentally very different from caring labor markets. Held's examination of these differences is subtle and very interesting, but she does not succeed in establishing that the ethics of care is the only or the most appropriate way to account for them. To accommodate these differences in kind, it seems enough to argue that there are many and mutually irreducible modes of valuing, besides assigning a market price, as Elizabeth Anderson has argued.

While the question as to whether the care approach is preferable to others remains open, another looms in the background: is the ethics of care an autonomous 'moral theory'? If the task is to redefine the boundaries of the moral domain, and refocus philosophical attention on neglected issues, Held's argument is successful. While it does little to sketch an alternative moral epistemology and lacks dialogical character, the book is very rich in quotations, and maps in significant detail current positions within care ethics. But as an attempt to place the ethics of care on the same footing as other moral theories, Held's argument fails to show that the defining concerns of care ethics cannot be adequately addressed by other theories. As an independent theoretical approach, the ethics of care is not yet justified.