The Ethics of Confucius and Aristotle: Mirrors of Virtue

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Jiyuan Yu, The Ethics of Confucius and Aristotle: Mirrors of Virtue, Routledge, 2007, 276pp., $110.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780415956475.

Reviewed by Brad Wilburn, Chadron State College


In this book, Jiyuan Yu engages in a comparison of the ethical thought of two highly influential thinkers, Confucius and Aristotle.  The book "aims at developing an interpretation of each side through comparison." (p. 3)  Yu appeals to Aristotle's metaphor of friends as mirrors for each other to describe his project.  Just as friends who are similar in virtue can see themselves better by looking at each other,

Taking [Aristotelian and Confucian ethics] as mirrors for each other leads us to reflect upon the traditional roots of both ethics, to examine their otherwise unexamined presuppositions, and to generate alternative perspectives to determine why each side proceeds in the way it does.  (p. 4) 

Thus, by the end of the volume, Yu has given us an interpretation of Aristotle, an interpretation of Confucius, and a thorough comparison of the two.

The comparison that Yu engages in is extensive in two ways.  First of all, he compares these thinkers across the broad range of their ethical thought, rather than focusing on one aspect of their views.  Secondly, he brings a broad range of texts into his discussion.  On the Aristotelian side, Yu focuses on Aristotle's Nicomachean Ethics (NE), though he makes some use of Eudemian Ethics and Magna Moralia, along with other works from Aristotle, where appropriate.  In addition, Yu engages in some discussion of Socrates and Plato to put Aristotle into context.  On the Confucian side, Yu makes use of the "Four Books" of classical Confucian thought, including not just the Analects, but also Mencius, The Great Learning, and The Doctrine of the Mean.

The chapters are organized thematically, with discussion of both Confucius and Aristotle taking place throughout.  In Chapter 1, he presents the central concepts of the views:  eudaimonia, or happiness, in Aristotle, the dao, or the way, in Confucius, and virtue in both of them.  In Chapter 2, he discusses the way in which these thinkers ground their ethical views in a concept of human nature.  In Chapters 3 through 5, Yu focuses on the Aristotelian practical virtues -- that is, the virtues of character along with the intellectual virtue of practical wisdom -- and the general Confucian virtue, ren.  Chapter 3 focuses on the doctrine of the mean in both of these thinkers.  Chapter 4 examines how virtues are cultivated -- the process of habituation in Aristotle and engagement in ritual in Confucius.  Chapter 5 looks at ethical wisdom.  In Chapters 6 and 7, Yu turns to a discussion of the highest good for these two thinkers -- contemplation for Aristotle and cheng (translated by Yu as "self-completion") for Confucius.  These final two chapters turn on a pair of distinctions that Yu points to in Aristotle, but that he does not find in Confucius.  Chapter 6 deals with a distinction between virtue and virtuous activity.  Building from this distinction, Yu develops an understanding of Aristotle's notion of eudaimonia that includes an ambiguity between acting well and living well.  Chapter 7 deals with a distinction between practical and theoretical wisdom.  Appealing once again to the ambiguity between acting well and living well that he finds in Aristotle, Yu wades into the dispute between inclusivism and intellectualism in Aristotelian scholarship.  He argues that Aristotle's notion of living well includes a broad range of goods and activities, while the highest form of acting well that we can engage in is intellectual activity.

Yu's discussion is chock-full of valuable insights and interesting suggestions.  I will list just a few.  First, Yu's discussion of the doctrine of the mean in Chapter 3 is built around an interesting presentation of the model of archery.  Confucius and Aristotle both make use of archery metaphors, and, Yu claims, this metaphor can help us properly understand the doctrine of the mean in these two thinkers.  Yu identifies "two views about what the mean is in both Aristotelian and Confucian ethics:  A) The mean lies in the middle of excess and deficiency.  B) The mean is what is right or appropriate." (p. 84)  The archery metaphor can help us unify these two views, he claims.  Success is a matter of hitting the right, the proper, target, and one can go astray on either side of the target, so hitting the right target is a matter of being in between two ways of going wrong.

As a further example, Yu gives an interesting reading of the unity of the virtues thesis that shows up in both Aristotle and Confucius.  He notes what it is that unifies the virtues for these thinkers:  practical wisdom for Aristotle (NE vi.13); learning about the rites (see Analects 17:8) and judgments of appropriateness (see Analects 17:23) for Confucius.  He notes that the claim is made about virtue in the full sense.  The lesson that Yu draws from this strikes me as the right lesson to draw:  "What this implies is that for both ethics, we are always on the road of cultivation and refinement, with regards to both particular virtue and general virtue." (p. 168)  The notion of full, complete virtue that grounds the claim that the various virtues of character are unified is the sort of notion that necessitates and can guide an ongoing project of self-cultivation.

As a final example, the claim that Yu develops and puts to use in his final two chapters that Aristotle's conception of eudaimonia is ambiguous between acting well and living well is a thought provoking suggestion.  Although I will raise some concerns about this claim below, it is important to acknowledge its value.  For one thing, Yu engages in a careful reading of the text when arguing for this claim.  Secondly, he applies this analysis in a consistent and systematic way to address two of the knottiest issues in Aristotle's ethics:  the role of external goods in Aristotle's concept of the good life and Aristotle's elevation of contemplation over a life of civic engagement in NE x.6-8.  By exploiting the ambiguity, Yu is able to acknowledge the importance of external goods and a life of civic engagement for eudaimonia understood as living well, while insisting that more exclusive claims are appropriate when we consider eudaimonia as acting well.

There are characteristic challenges involved in a project with the sort of ambition that Yu's project displays.  For one thing, scholarly discussion of Aristotelian and Confucian thought has been going on for millennia, and so, as Yu often acknowledges, it would be impossible to engage in a thorough discussion of these scholarly disputes.  What this means is that there is a tricky tightrope to be walked.  On the one hand, given the ambitious scope, one does not want to get bogged down in too many details.  On the other hand, it would also be a mistake to examine the forest without looking at any trees.  For the most part, Yu does an admirable job walking this tightrope.  He does a good job setting out the controversies based on a careful reading of the primary texts.  He describes the scholarly disputes without caricaturing them or getting bogged down in them.  He clearly presents his positions, which are typically plausible and effectively grounded in the text, even though he is unable to trace through all the possible lines of arguments against various opponents.  For a work that attempts to cover as much ground as Yu's work does, this is the right approach to take.

Another challenge that attends the sort of thoroughgoing comparison in which Yu is engaged is that sometimes the points of comparison can be forced.  Yu has avoided this, for the most part.  Though he is able to identify many interesting parallels, he is also judicious about acknowledging differences.  A typical pattern is that he will point out how two different concepts (such as habituation in Aristotle and adherence to the rites in Confucius) play similar functional roles, even though they do so in different ways.  For instance, in Chapters 6 and 7, Yu draws a rough parallel between cheng, or self-completion, in Confucius and contemplation in Aristotle.  Yu claims that these two notions serve as the highest goods for the two thinkers, but his discussion in those two chapters emphasizes the differences between them.  Cheng is virtue, while contemplation is virtuous activity.  Further, contemplation is the excellent exercise of our theoretical reason for Aristotle, while Confucius has no separate category of theoretical wisdom.  The main additional similarity between these two concepts that Yu points to is that contemplation is the activity of the most divine part of us, while cheng is the full actualization of our human nature, which was given to us by Heaven, and links us to the heavenly.  So Yu has a keen eye for interesting parallels, yet he avoids mischaracterizing the views just to force them into lockstep with each other.

Given the scope of Yu's project, it is likely that any reader familiar with one or both of these thinkers will disagree with some of the details of Yu's interpretations and comparisons.  I will point to two disagreements that I had, though I would like to make two general points first.  First of all, I do not regard these inevitable disagreements as a weakness of Yu's treatment.  By providing us with a wide-ranging interpretation of Aristotelian ethics, a wide-ranging interpretation of Confucian ethics, and a wide-ranging comparison of the two, by staking out clear positions on many of these issues, Yu is facilitating a very productive scholarly discussion in which many of these particular disputes are put in a broader context.  Secondly, I recognize that my list of nits to pick may be idiosyncratic.  Other scholars may well agree with Yu on these issues and disagree with him on others where I thought he was going in the right direction.

First of all, I have a concern about Yu's claim that Aristotle's conception of eudaimonia is ambiguous between acting well and living well.  This is the claim that drives Yu's analysis in Chapters 6 and 7.  My concern is that Aristotle would not want to maintain a distinction here that would allow him to move back and forth between two different notions of happiness.  My reading of the function argument (NE i.7) is that Aristotle is trying to understand living well in terms of acting well.  A genuinely human life is characterized by a certain sort of activity (rational activity), and so a good human life (or, living well for a human) is characterized in terms of doing that activity well, or excellently, or virtuously.  This does leave Aristotle with the challenges that come along with identifying living well too closely with acting well, and so perhaps it is difficult to say how far down this road he ends up going, but this does seem to be the Aristotelian road.

Secondly, it seems to me that Yu overstates the difference between the two thinkers when he claims that the highest good for Aristotle is virtuous activity "but not the possession of virtue," (p. 22) whereas for Confucius, "What matters is virtue rather than its activity." (p. 191)  He points to the claim in Aristotle that one might possess virtue while one is asleep, but that this would not constitute a good life.  He argues that "from Confucius' point of view, it is disturbing that Aristotle compares a virtuous life to a sleeping state." (p. 193)  He points to the example of Yen Hui, a disciple of Confucius who was highly favored, even though he lacked external goods, was not a man of great achievement, and died a premature death.  "If Aristotle were invited to evaluate Yen Hui's life," claims Yu, "the result would be different" (p. 191) from Confucius' positive evaluation.  Yu may well be right that there is a contrast to be drawn here, but I would regard it as a contrast in emphasis more than substance, and that both thinkers would regard both virtue and virtuous activity as vitally important.  As Yu points out, Confucians do not tend to draw this distinction, but this is because "they seem to assume that if the agent possesses virtue, then when in a position to practice it, he will do it." (p. 176)  This strikes me as less of a diminishment of the value of virtuous activity as it is an unstated commitment to the inseparability of virtuous activity from virtue.  If asked about a virtuous person who lived her whole life asleep, it seems to me that Confucius' response would not be to insist that such a person lived a life of undiminished value, but he would be puzzled over how such a life could be considered a virtuous life.  Yen Hui's life may have been without major achievement or external goods, but presumably it was not without extensive virtuous activity.  In the passages cited by Yu on p. 190, Yen Hui is described as not venting his anger, as not making the same mistake twice, as listening to Confucius with unflagging attention, and as going forward when employed.  These all seem to be examples of him exercising his excellence, not just possessing it.  As for Aristotle, I disagree with Yu's claim that "It is certainly strange that Aristotle takes virtue as the central topic of his eudaimonism and devotes the bulk of the Nicomachean Ethics to virtue, but then claims that without activity, a virtuous life amounts to a life asleep." (p. 193)  Virtue will still be a central topic, even if virtuous activity is the highest good, since virtue is central to virtuous activity.  And Aristotle's "sleeping thesis" is not framed as a claim that a virtuous life is like a sleeping life, but rather that a sleeping life could be one in which the sleeper merely possessed virtue, and we would not regard such a sleep-filled life as a compelling goal, just because the sleeper possessed virtue.  Aristotle may not be right here, but it does not seem "simply too strong" (p. 194) to insist that the value of virtue is intimately tied to its exercise.

All in all, however, this is a very valuable volume.  It is a rich and textually grounded discussion of these two thinkers.  It is an illuminating account of the parallels and divergences between them.  Throughout the work, Yu makes a host of productive suggestions and thought provoking claims that further our understanding of both of these thinkers, as well as our understanding of the deep issues with which they both wrestle.