The Ethics of Counterterrorism

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Isaac Taylor, The Ethics of Counterterrorism, Routledge, 2018, 162pp., $140.00 (hbk), ISBN 9781138498105.

Reviewed by Michael Robillard, University of Oxford


Isaac Taylor offers a thorough and highly timely book-length treatment of the various ethical challenges that terrorism poses for liberal democracies in the 21st century. Throughout, Taylor provides a balanced, rigorous, and nuanced account of the various moral issues raised by counterterrorism and clearly articulates the major points of ethical and pragmatic tension within this new and still developing area of philosophical inquiry. Given the new and growing threats that terrorist organizations pose to liberal democracies and to the international order more broadly and given that these organizations do not seem to fit cleanly within our traditional moral and legal frameworks for domestic policing or armed conflict, Taylor argues that what is fundamentally needed is an exceptionalist approach to counterterrorism, which requires a suspension of traditional moral rules and moral frameworks. He writes,

a distinct set of rules are needed to govern counterterrorist efforts by governments and other actors. Thought of in this way, counterterrorism is subject to what Fritz Allhoff calls an 'ethics of exceptionalism' according to which the War on Terror, through its novel face and extreme stakes suggests . . . that we need to make exceptions to traditional norms.

Taylor goes on to explain why this exceptionalist account should apply to various moral issues within counterterrorism, including the definition of terrorism, mass surveillance and privacy, the suspension of civil liberties, military responses to terrorism, criminal justice and the detainment of terrorists, negotiating with terrorists, and cultural integration as a method of counter-radicalization.

Borrowing G.A. Cohen's distinction between 'fundamental (normative) principles' and 'rules of regulation', Taylor argues for exceptionalism with respect to the latter. On Taylor's reading of Cohen, fundamental principles give first-order normative reasons (deontological, consequentialist, virtue theoretic, etc.) while rules of regulation are second-order conventions, rules, and ways in which we implement first-order principles in specific situations. Taylor notes, for example, that the principle 'maximize happiness for the greatest number' doesn't say anything about how it should be implemented in a given situation. To apply it, Taylor argues, we need rules of regulation that are sensitive to the contingencies of our non-normative world. Taylor contrasts this view with the exceptionalism of Michael Walzer who, on Taylor's reading, advocates a suspension of first-order moral principles in war. Taylor rejects this with respect to counterterrorism.

While I find Taylor's thesis unsatisfactory in certain respects -- particularly its cursory account of contemporary just war theory and its thin articulation of the first order principles ostensibly informing his exceptionalist prescriptions -- the book as a whole has major strengths as well as many persuasive sub-arguments that succeed on their own merits. I will now highlight some of these. I will then explore Taylor's thesis in greater detail and offer an argument about what further work needs to be done.

One obvious strength of the book is the thoroughness with which Taylor addresses the ethical issues of counterterrorism. He lays out very clearly the contours of the conceptual terrain in both the domestic and military spheres. The way he parses and categorizes the various sub-issues within the broader counterterrorism debate makes good, practical sense. Lastly, the way he lays out and articulates the various logical entailments as well as prudential and moral trade-offs for each major ethical issue is nuanced, fair, and balanced.

One notable strength of Taylor's work is his articulation of the ethical issues in the domestic sphere. For instance, I found his chapter on mass surveillance to be particularly persuasive. As he points out, most arguments for the permissibility of mass surveillance and data collection appeal to three common justifications: that surveillance and data collection need not violate citizens' rights to privacy, that surveillance of individuals is justified on lesser evil grounds, and that individuals hypothetically consent and therefore waive their rights against such surveillance. The first justification is based on the claim that institutional safeguards can be put in place to prevent impermissible privacy invasions. Taylor rightly responds that in practice, even with the best safeguards and even with all government agents acting responsibly, the strong dependency of the state on private entities nonetheless creates conditions whereby access to a person's personal data could be acquired by hackers or others, giving them a significant degree of power over individual citizens.

The second justification is that citizens' collective security ultimately trumps individual privacy rights . 'Supreme emergency' arguments, Taylor notes, operate by a similar kind of reasoning. In supreme emergencies, such as an imminent Nazi occupation, the prima facie privacy rights of the individual citizen are not violated but instead justifiably infringed to secure the greater good of avoiding a Nazi occupation. The threat of terrorism, so the argument goes, is relevantly similar and can also justify rights infringements. Taylor, however, rightly points out that the cases are disanalogous in that counterterrorism is generally directed against threats that are not imminent. For surveillance data to be useful in preventing a terrorist attack, it must be gathered and interpreted well in advance of the attack. For such a surveillance regime to succeed, governments must continually infringe privacy rights to anticipate and be ready to respond to an attack. This is all quite different, Taylor argues, from an imminent Nazi invasion. Hence, this sort of lesser evil justification for infringing of individual privacy rights fails.

The third justification for the permissibility of mass surveillance appeals to hypothetical consent. Taylor rightly rejects this argument mainly because of the impossibility of informed consent by the majority of average citizens who lack the time, energy, and esoteric knowledge to understand all of the ways in which their private data could be used.

Taylor instead argues for a fourth justification for mass surveillance: that citizens can reasonably be asked to forfeit some degree of privacy for reasons of reciprocity. Here, Taylor invokes H.L.A. Hart's claim that "when a number of persons conduct any joint enterprise according to rules that restrict their liberty, those who have submitted to these restrictions when required have a right to a similar submission from those who have benefitted by their submission." On this view, since the shared social good of security against terrorist threats is both non-excludable and presumptively beneficial, Taylor argues, citizens who waive their right to privacy to some degree can reasonably demand of other citizens that they do the same. Taylor argues that this principle of reciprocity can justify not only existing surveillance regimes but can likewise justify the bootstrapping of new surveillance regimes out of the initial waivers of privacy rights by some sufficiently large number of citizens. This argument for a state's surveillance of its citizens for the sake of counterterrorism seems to me most plausible out of the four Taylor considers.

I turn now to some of the weaknesses of Taylor's work. One is the chapter on military responses to terrorism. For Taylor's discussion of just war theory fails to acknowledge the 'revisionist' school of thought that has emerged over the last decade or so in the work of philosophers such as Jeff McMahan, David Rodin, and Helen Frowe. This school of thought is 'revisionist' because it rejects the traditional premise that the morality of war is somehow exceptional or different on the first-order level from the morality of individual defense. Some of the entailments of this view are a denial of the just war principle of the moral equality of combatants, a denial of the principle of noncombatant immunity, and, often, the denial of legitimate authority -- all at the level of first-order morality.[1] These omissions are important because they have direct bearing on the novelty of Taylor's 'consequentialist' solution to military responses to counterterrorism as well as on his claims about the inability of existing moral frameworks in just war theory to provide an adequate account of counterterrorism.

In this same chapter, Taylor considers and rejects two exceptionalist accounts, one from Nicholas Fotion, the other from Stephen Coleman, arguing for a suspension of traditional just war constraints on combatting terrorism. He then argues for a third kind of justification for exceptionalism which he calls the 'consequentialist' view. Despite just war theory's having a strong deontological grounding, Taylor argues that there are nonetheless substantial consequentialist grounds for many just war principles. He argues that just war theory is concerned with the production of good consequences (such as a peaceful community free from terrorist threats) and that the production of such consequences could justify the suspension or loosening of standard ad bellum and in bello principles. He then argues that relaxing traditional just war principles such as Just Cause, Legitimate Authority, and Discrimination when combating terrorism could yield better overall consequences than the status quo war convention and therefore could justifiably be suspended.

For instance, Taylor notes that the typical just war interpretation of the requirement of Just Cause does not allow for the permissibility of preventive wars. Taylor argues, however, that preventive wars against terrorist organizations operating in hiding could be one of our best options for thwarting their decentralized attacks and thus could satisfy the Just Cause criterion. Similarly, Taylor notes that if a capable non-state actor such as the hacker group Anonymous could effectively disrupt terrorist networks, their action could be permissible whether or not they would constitute a legitimate authority. Lastly, with respect to the jus in bello principle of Discrimination, Taylor cites arguments from Tamar Meisels and Daniel Statman to the effect that, given that terrorist groups target innocent people, states then have no reciprocal duty to refrain from targeting members of terrorist organizations who are not engaging in overtly hostile activities. This could then justify strikes on terrorist barracks, sleeping quarters, etc. -- in other words, a loosening of standard Discrimination criteria.

While I agree with many of Taylor's intuitions about the cases that he cites, I disagree with his views about the normative principles underpinning such intuitions. For instance, in the case of Just Cause, preventive wars against terrorist organizations could be plausibly justified primarily on liability grounds instead of consequentialist grounds as Taylor suggests. If members of a terrorist group are preparing to act in a way that would violate the rights of innocent persons, that makes them liable to proportionate and necessary attack. They will have forfeited their right not to be eliminatively or perhaps even opportunistically harmed.

Likewise, in the case of Legitimate Authority, it seems that groups like ISIS or Al Qaeda, because of their past and likely future action, could make themselves liable to necessary and proportionate harm not only from states but also from non-state actors. Granted, it would still be an open question how much harm a non-state actor could justifiably inflict on members of such groups 'in behalf' of some other political community. However, the feature that would justify such a permission would mainly be the consent of the members of that community instead of some other set of consequentialist reasons. Lastly, with respect to the principle of Discrimination, if members of a terrorist group have acted in ways that suggest they will violate the rights of innocent persons (i.e. if they are operating in a 'constant combat function'), then independent of whether they are sleeping in a barracks or arming a bomb, their behaviour makes them liable to proportionate and necessary attack. Accordingly, no additional appeal to consequentialist reasons of reciprocity between combatants would be needed to justify such an attack. When we consider the full range of normative reasons, including liability justifications, it is unclear that consequentialist reasons are needed to do the necessary explanatory work.

Finally, I think Taylor fails to provide a sufficiently substantive positive account of his own in addition to his criticisms of existing moral and legal conventions. While several of his sub-arguments succeed and could indeed warrant the making of procedural exceptions for their respective contexts, I fail to find a unifying rationale for his various disparate ethical prescriptions apart from the shared property of standing-in-relation-to terrorism. Taylor does an excellent job of pointing out the various ways in which terrorism raises serious problems for our existing moral conventions; and he offers several excellent prescriptions for how second-order conventions -- that is, 'rules of regulation' -- can be amended so as to better resolve these problems. Taylor fails, however, to articulate a sufficiently complete set of first-order normative reasons -- that is, 'fundamental principles' -- or to show how such reasons hang together with other epistemic and pragmatic reasons. Without a sufficiently developed account of the full set of first-order moral reasons and how they are related to and trade off against one another, it is difficult to determine whether the existing moral conventions governing counterterrorism are sufficiently responsive to these moral reasons or whether their inadequacies do in fact warrant the making of exceptions[2].

What Taylor's exceptionalist account might be more accurately picking out then is not actually a unique set of ethical problems arising from terrorism per se but rather a set of ethical problems arising from the fundamental gaps in and inadequacies of our current moral conventions, institutions, and conceptual frameworks more generally where the specific issue of terrorism is but one symptom of a much larger and more systemic inadequacy. As with the advent of gunpowder or trench warfare, newly emerging weapons, informational, and automated technologies and the so-called individualization of war have served to usher in a new and similar proto-conventional phase in which our new capacities have begun to outstrip the once useful conventions, social coordination practices, and conceptual categories of a bygone technological epoch. On this explanation, terrorism might best be understood as a symptom of something much larger and systemic and may even warrant a more sweeping kind of exceptionalism than that which Taylor defends.

In summary, Taylor has done an excellent job of identifying where the major points of ethical, conceptual, and prudential tension lie within the contemporary debate about counterterrorism and has shown where greater attention must be focused in updating our institutions, conventions, and practices. While Taylor's argument succeeds in clearly outlining the problems that global terrorism has generated within our moral institutions, it falls short of providing us with the requisite concepts and fine-grained distinctions necessary to guide us in repairing these institutions.

For this to be done successfully, issues in the background and on the periphery of the counterterrorism debate must also be further explored. These include but are not limited to: Does legitimate authority generate additional moral reason-giving force of its own? If so, how and under what conditions? To what degree is the international state system revisable? To what degree do conventions, proto-conventional behaviours, and speech acts generate new reason-giving conventions? What responsibilities do civilians have to incur some degree of physical risk for the sake of counterterrorism efforts? And how should government transparency be traded off against prudential and strategic considerations requiring clandestine acts? Finally, if we are to amend our institutions to enable them to respond to the threat of terrorism both ethically and effectively, more empirical research must also be done at the level of the counterterrorism practitioner as well as on contemporary terror incidents and contemporary terrorist strategy.

As I have suggested, the fine-grained theoretical machinery Taylor would need to begin fleshing out a more theoretically robust account and to begin fixing the inadequacies of our current institutions already exists, at least in part, within contemporary just war theory. Accordingly, I believe he could make good use of this conceptual apparatus without having to re-invent the wheel. All this being said, I believe Taylor's work to be an important contribution to the advancement of our overall understanding of the ethical issues surrounding counterterrorism and I look forward to seeing how he further develops this work in the future.

[1] Taylor likewise fails to acknowledge contemporary alternative positions to this revisionist view offered by philosophers such as Seth Lazar, Henry Shue, Yitzhak Benbaji, and Uwe Steinhoff, who attempt to rehabilitate aspects of the more traditional, Walzerian view by appealing to various deontological, rule-consequentialist, and contractualist arguments. Taylor also fails in this chapter to acknowledge important work in social ontology relating to the moral reason-giving force of conventions and institutions by such philosophers as Seumas Miller.

[2] Indeed this twofold distinction itself might be too simplistic. For instance, there arguably could be a high level principle of utility that then informs a mid-level institutional principle of, for instance, law enforcement for police services, and thirdly, a low level regulations concerning the use of force under specific circumstances and contexts.