The Ethics of Deference: Learning from Law's Morals

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Soper, Philip, The Ethics of Deference: Learning from Law's Morals, Cambridge University Press, 2002, 205pp, $23.00 (pbk), ISBN 0521008727.

Reviewed by Leslie Green, York University


According to many legal philosophers, law claims that its subjects have an obligation to obey it. According to many moral philosophers, no credible justification for authority will validate the wide sweep of law’s claims. Even in a reasonably just state, law’s authority is not always justified. But the law doesn’t say that people must obey it except when moral philosophy permits otherwise; the law says people must obey except when it permits otherwise. So what law claims is one thing, what it deserves is another. Philip Soper has for some time been perplexed by this difference. This gap, he feels, marks an “oddity” (xiv), a “conflict” (12), a “stalemate” (13)—maybe even a “paradox.” (52) He wonders,

How could it be that the practice of law, in the claims it makes, is so out of step … with the conclusions of moral philosophy? … [S]houldn’t the discrepancy induce reconsideration of either the normative or the descriptive claim? (78)

Soper reconsiders both in this clear, stimulating, and enormously helpful book. The first part is built around an analysis and critique of the obligation-centered account of legal authority. Law, he argues, does not in fact claim obedience; it claims only that its norms are correct and that it is morally entitled to enforce them whether or not they are correct. Thus, “legal obligations are at most only statements about what one ought to do, not statements about the obligations that subjects have.”(90) But on Soper’s account law still makes moral claims, and he argues that for these claims to be intelligible and made in good faith they must also have some degree of validity, thus endorsing a natural-law position. The second part of the book puts the case that, even though law doesn’t claim an obligation to obey, there is one—or at any rate an obligation to defer. Law’s subjects should give weight to its requirements, even when they think them wrong, and even when they have not consented to its rule. The proper degree of deference varies according to the sort of law that is in question; perhaps it even varies among subjects. But people may on no account simply proceed as if there were no law, or as if it were entitled only to such deference as they think that it deserves on its merits. The nature and grounds of deference in general are explored in two fine chapters about promise-keeping and fair play. These cast new light on the sort of reasons we have for complying with law, without reducing them to an instance of either of those obligations. (These chapters will be of great interest to moral philosophers, but I shall not explore their arguments here.) The emerging theory of political obligation is pluralistic, with a heavily Kantian tinge: in addition to such instrumental, respect-showing and cooperation-sustaining reasons as we may have, we must also to defer to law in order to keep faith with our own principles.

Soper is not the first to focus on the right to coerce instead of the duty to obey. But it is important to see that he is not just resurrecting Kelsen’s view that laws are norms authorizing officials to coerce subjects. He adds two very unkelsenian thoughts: that legal norms are meant for the guidance of their subjects and are claimed by law to be correct, and that the law also claims that it is morally entitled to enforce them. Now, judges often disown any claim that they must endorse the rules they apply—they speak as if law has authority independent of its content (that is what motivates the obligation-centered view). But Soper’s is not a thesis about what judges say; it is about what we need to impute to the law, regarded impersonally, in order to make overall sense of our practices. He maintains that we can explain law’s normativity in terms of its claim to correct content, and that we can explain its exigency in terms of its claim to justified enforcement. The claim to moral authority—and the correlative duty to obey the law for content-independent reasons—thus drops out, which is just as well, because “Legal systems are not in the business of making pronouncements on fundamental questions of moral philosophy; they are, rather, in the business simply of making judgments about the norms to be enforced in a society.”(85)

Of the various sorts of deference Soper explores, the obligation to defer to law comes nearest to the obligation of a promise, though it is not founded on it. The obligations to defer to the views of friends, or to play fair by deferring to the distributive preferences of those with whom we cooperate, are dominated by instrumental considerations—they preserve and sustain those forms of relationship. Such reasons exist also in law, but here context is everything: it is always possible to construct cases in which those values are either not at stake or are not threatened by non-compliance. The obligation of a promise, in contrast, is more deontological. In addition to instrumental reasons, here we also have important reasons to defer in order to keep faith with ourselves. In the case of promising, of course, deferring to the wishes of the promisee is not only keeping faith with a principle that one would endorse were the positions reversed, it is also performing an obligation that one willingly assumed. In that respect, law is importantly different: few people choose to subject themselves to the law, and fewer still choose the very laws that will be enforced against them. But following a line of thought familiar from Kant, Soper argues that in obedience to law, necessity fulfils the function that in promising is played by will:

The question of why I should defer to the norms of the state is answered by reminding myself of the point of the state and the sense in which it represents values that, I, too, endorse. The state is necessary, and it is the kind of entity that requires some to govern, in good faith, on behalf of all. Thus I, who could do no different were I in charge, have a prima facie reason to do as I would expect others in my situation to do. (167)

Where does all this leave the gap between claim and entitlement that motivates the book? Well, that gap is gone, because the claim to obedience has been abandoned. But Soper holds that law claims both rectitude in content and a right to enforce. And since he allows that law is fallible, each of these claims may in turn exceed what a given legal system is morally entitled to. It is true that if these gaps become wide enough, Soper will close them by denying the norms in question the title of “law” (I’ll come to that shortly.) But narrower gaps are still real gaps. The law says its norms are correct, but they may not be: there may be areas in which the law shouldn’t be setting norms at all (even if law is a necessary institution, it doesn’t follow that all laws are necessary laws). Or again: the law says its good faith effort to regulate and enforce provides a full excuse for wrongdoing on its part—but it may in a given case provide only a partial excuse or a weak mitigation. The fact that the law is trying in good faith to perform a necessary task does not mean that its failures are irrelevant to the question of its moral entitlements; at most it provides a cushion of legitimacy. Perhaps a legal system that is trying hard can only sink so far. But that does not entail that it cannot sink below what it claims for itself. Should Soper worry about these gaps? I think not—but then he shouldn’t have been worried about the original gap either. The are two reasons. First, the new gaps are the distance between law’s claim to comprehensive right to enforce and its moral entitlement to a more limited one. But the original gap was simply the distance between law’s claim to a comprehensive duty to obey and its entitlement to a more limited one. No (except perhaps Robert Paul Wolff) says that law has none of the authority it claims. If legal theory can tolerate the enforcement gap, then it can also tolerate the authority gap; they are structurally identical. Second, there is actually nothing paradoxical or puzzling about any of these gaps. While there is no doubt that descriptive jurisprudence is value-laden, there is also no reason to think that it answers directly to the constraints of moral philosophy. Consider an analogy. Suppose we were trying to characterize the social role of the Pope. When speaking ex cathedra the Pope claims infallible authority in certain matters of faith. Would a sound philosophical argument against papal infallibility make us doubt that Popes actually claim it? There is no reason to think so. Claims, like beliefs, are determined by the roles they play in our lives, and these roles do not depend on their validity or their truth.

One of the pleasures of this book is the opportunity it affords to wrestle with some sophisticated, conceptual arguments for the view that law is an essentially moral enterprise. Many juris-moralizers have abandoned such arguments in favor views based on the nature of adjudication. For example, Ronald Dworkin says if we look closely at courts’ reasoning, we will often find them relying on moral judgment. If we add to this (correct) observation the idea that the law is nothing more (and nothing less) than any valid reason for a court’s decision, we will get the conclusion that morality is part of the law. (We also get the conclusion that grammar, arithmetic, and principles of animal husbandry are part of the law, for those too provide valid reasons for deciding certain cases—some of us count that as an objection to Dworkin’s theory.)

Soper refuses Dworkin’s line. He derives moral requirements on legal validity, not from a theory of adjudication, but from a theory of the nature of law. He writes,

Legal systems, if they are not to collapse into coercive systems, must in short admit that all standards tentatively identified as law by a positivist pedigree will count as valid law only if they are not too unjust and thus remain capable of supporting a good-faith claim that using coercion to enforce the law is morally permissible. (97)

The move from the idea that law necessarily makes a moral claim, to the conclusion that law necessarily has moral merit crucially relies on this idea of good faith. What does good faith require? If it were, say, merely a matter of sincerity, the inference would fail. There must be substantive, and not just procedural, limits to what one can claim in good faith. I think Soper assumes that justice must in some measure actually be done in order to be claimed (in good faith) to be done. He clearly needs some such premise, and some defense of it. For without that, we would have law necessarily making moral claims for itself, but not necessarily securing moral merit for itself. And that position any legal positivist can accept (which shows, incidentally, why we should not describe positivism as the doctrine that there is no necessary “connection” between law and morality).

Although Soper’s natural law is not based on a theory of adjudication, one might be tempted to think it has consequences for such a theory, for a crucial element in his test for law is someone’s certification that it is “not too unjust.” So we might expect that judges would, in addition to the usual source-based tests of validity, also check to ensure that there is no “serious moral error”(97) that might nullify a putative law. Surprisingly, Soper does not take this line either. He says that adjudication can skip the moral test, for all legal systems normally satisfy it. Moreover, they satisfy it with such reliability that positivist tests for law work as a kind of evidentiary presumption: “In most cases a social facts test for law probably is reliable and conclusive on the question of legal validity because in most cases the pedigreed norm probably cannot be said to be too unjust to be called law.”(99) The moral test for law thus normally plays no role in adjudication: we go on as before, though not forgetting the (remote) possibility that, “in theory”(99), a so-called law may be too unjust to merit the name.

I confess to a certain disappointment whenever a natural lawyer’s build-up to the importance of moral criteria for the existence of law is followed by the let-down assurance that most laws meet the criteria. Not of course in Nazi Germany or old South Africa, the familiar stalking-horses. But what about the United States? One might naturally suppose it a consequence of Soper’s view that the U.S. had no legal system at all before 1965 (or, if that seems tendentious, before 1870), and also that the Supreme Court decision in Bowers v. Hardwick contributed no law to its current legal system. After all, many of us take slavery, segregation, and the criminalization of harmless intimacy to be paradigm cases of “serious moral error.” So the unreconstructed U.S. constitution was nothing approaching “a good faith attempt to administer in the interests of all”(166)—some abolitionists called it a “pact with the devil.” The fact that public opinion divided (and may even still divide) on these matters is irrelevant. Soper’s is not a test of popular approval; a serious moral error is one “which no reasonable person could in good faith fail to acknowledge.”(97) So which bullet will Soper bite? Will he say that the United States, for most of its history, had no legal system, and that seriously unjust Supreme Court decisions make no law? Or will he say that there is, after all, reasonable doubt whether the racism or heterosexism involves serious moral error? Both strike me as very costly ways of resisting the old idea that the existence of law is one thing, its merit and demerit another.