The Ethics of Embryonic Stem Cell Research

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Katrien Devolder, The Ethics of Embryonic Stem Cell Research, Oxford University Press, 2015, 167pp., $49.50 (hbk), ISBN 9780199547999.

Reviewed by John-Erik Stig Hansen, Statens Serum Institut, Copenhagen


Bioethical debate on the beginning of human life and its moral value has become increasingly intense during the last fifty years. Abortion gave rise to serious and very basic questions concerning the moral status of embryos in the 1960s. In vitro fertilization, now a routine procedure, has led to multiple and diverse ethical conundrums concerning the early human embryo that involve technical issues as well as fundamental moral questions. The particular problem Katrien Devolder examines is whether we should support embryonic stem cell research even if it involves destruction of embryos or abstain from such research even if doing so prevents us from gaining the potential benefits of new medical treatments. Specifically, Devolder examines whether there might be a moral middle ground between these opposite positions and whether there might be some technical ways to reap the benefits of embryonic stem cell research without destroying any human embryos. Underlying her discussion is the premise that the human embryo from the very beginning, as a zygote immediately after fertilization, has a significant degree of moral value -- otherwise there would not be a problem and scientific embryo research would have fewer moral constraints.

Devolder explicitly does not examine the justification for any particular view on the moral status of the human embryo but rather takes it as a given that human embryos have a non-specified but uniformly "significant" value for the purpose of this book. This may be acceptable as embryos relevant for embryonic stem cell harvest are at an early stage of development (up till the blastocyst stage at day 6). It follows that considerations that might be important for evaluating moral status at somewhat later, or even much later, stages do not apply. Those who hold that embryos from fertilization onwards to have full human status from the moment of conception would not allow the use of embryos anyway, and their position is, therefore, not dealt with further. It is often argued, on the basis of their potential to become human persons, that early stage human embryos have moral status. And if one defines the moral status of an embryo depending on its developmental stage, this means that it has an intermediate moral status. Similarly, one might argue that the degree of biological likeness to the natural human embryo could determine the degree of moral status of its derivatives or its functional equivalents. But because the book abstains from being explicit in what the underlying basis is for regarding the early human embryo as having a moral status and significant moral value, parts of the subsequent argumentation seem less stringent than might have been.

The practical, medical value of embryonic stem cells is mostly hypothetical at the moment. As fetal development proceeds, the early embryonic cells will normally differentiate into various tissues that have specialized stem cells to maintain these tissues. In medical practice, tissue-specific stem cells are used to treat various blood disorders; such stem cells come from the patient himself or a very close relative in order to ensure immunological compatibility after transplantation. Embryonic stem cells may be harvested from the blastocyst stage of development, a procedure which will terminate the embryo. Such cells have the potential advantage of being able to differentiate into any kind of tissue ("pluripotency") and thus able to remedy a multitude of diseases. However, since the embryo-donor is genetically unrelated to the patient, immunological incompatibility poses a serious if not insurmountable problem.

Pluripotency may, however, be achieved with full immunological compatibility without using unrelated embryos. The first method ("somatic cell nuclear transfer", SCNT) is to use an unfertilized egg cell, typically donated by a woman undergoing fertility treatment. Removing the nucleus from such an egg cell and replacing it with a nucleus from a patient cell will initiate the development of a blastocyst from which stem cells may be harvested even without fertilization. These stem cells will behave almost like embryonic stem cells - i.e., be pluripotent - but will be genetically identical with the patient. The second method ("induced pluripotent stem cell", iPSC) resets adult cells back to an early developmental stage after they have been grown in a culture medium containing specific biochemical compounds. This technique does not involve any embryos, and the pluripotent cells are those of the patient himself. However, as Devolder also mentions, new research shows that both techniques, at least for now, result in pluripotent cells that are epigenetically different from embryonic stem cells (SCNT to a lesser degree and iPSC to a higher degree), and their eventual behavior after transplantation back into the patient is uncertain.

Surplus embryos left over after successful fertility treatments are used in research. Such "discarded" embryos result when a couple in IVF treatment have more fertilized embryos than are used to produce pregnancy. If not used at a later date, such embryos remain frozen until they are destroyed or used for research at the discretion of the couple. If used for research - including embryonic stem cell generation - the embryos are eventually destroyed within a few days. Many countries allow the use of discarded embryos for research but do not allow de-novo creation of embryos for research, including SCNT embryos.

Devolder finds such discrimination untenable. Her detailed analysis of the Nothing-is-lost principle is quite astute. Countries that prohibit the creation of human embryos solely for research purposes may do so in order not to demean the moral status of humans as the ethical cost for the researcher as well as for society could be regarded as higher than the potential medical benefit. On the other hand, the same countries might regard discarded embryos from IVF treatment as doomed anyway and thus as not incurring any additional cost for society if used for research. Devolder, however, argues that discarded embryos only exist in the first place because the IVF procedure chosen includes the premeditated creation of surplus embryos, which at the moment is estimated to result in many hundreds of thousands of embryos remaining in frozen storage. Thus the Nothing-is-lost principle gives no significant moral advantage to using only discarded embryos. Devolder points out that creating embryos for research purposes or as spare embryos to spare women the discomfort of additional IVF treatment could well be regarded as of equal (im)moral value. To avoid this, IVF in Italy originally (2004-2009) only allowed fertilization of a maximum of 3 egg cells, which were all used for subsequent implantation with no consideration of gaining research material or women's comfort.

Even if one deems wrong the destruction of embryos that results from harvesting stem cells from them, it might still be morally legitimate to use the stem cells for research if they have previously been produced by others. This has actually been the position of some countries. Although Devolder finds a significant difference in moral status between embryos and stem cells, she also finds that using stem cells is as bad as deriving them. For the mere research use of stem cells creates a demand for them and a research environment which will encourage further embryo destruction. So differentiating between using and deriving embryonic stem cells is not a viable option if one wants to avoid moral inconsistency.

In a similar way, Devolder believes that the moral dilemma is not solved by abstaining from the use of embryonic stem cells in favor of solely working on perfecting the iPSC technique or the SCNT method for resetting patient cells to a pluripotent stage. In both cases, she puts forward the rather dubious suggestion that perfecting these alternative methods presupposes research with embryonic stem cells against which they can be compared. She suggests that this will create a demand for human embryos for research purposes and, even if only indirectly linked, research on iPSC and SCNT would therefore share in the moral responsibility for the problematic destruction of human embryos. Furthermore, Devolder finds that as the SCNT method results in a cellular tissue quite similar to an embryo resulting from natural fertilization of an egg cell with a sperm cell, SCNT constructs have equal moral status to embryos. Although such a status has been contested in previous bioethical literature, most countries disallow creation of SCNT constructs/embryos for research purposes. Such a position may partly be in order to avoid a 'slippery slope' leading to reproductive cloning. However, a technical solution exists whereby a genetic modification of the patient cell or the enucleated egg cell prior to their fusion blocks development of a placenta. This allows for development of a partial blastocyst and pluripotent stem cell harvest but at no point is there an embryo or a potential for fetal development and birth of a human person. Somewhat surprisingly, Devolder accepts an argument that the modified SCNT construct ('ANT') could be perceived as a disabled embryo and as we would not regard a disabled person having reduced moral status because of a disablement, so should one not regard the modified SCNT construct as having reduced moral status compared to a normal human embryo.

The SCNT method ("cloning") itself is routinely used today in animals, and it may have great human potential for stem cell or tissue production in the future, especially when combined with recent genome editing techniques. While cloning in animals is allowed to result in progeny, such use in humans is universally prohibited. For the moment, safety reasons alone would clearly make it unethical in humans, but bioethical considerations in this field can be expected to need revisiting, not least because improvements in technical methods will require extensive experimentation. In her book, Devolder has examined several arguments and considerations that are relevant for finding a morally correct and consistent position in dealing with human embryonic stem cells or functional equivalents. It is a weakness that she does not discuss in detail what her basis is for proposing a moral status for the early human embryo -- apart from a rejection of forward-looking potentiality. This means that the biological differences and similarities between human embryos and SCNTs, ANTs or iPSCs are difficult to translate into moral significance in a consistent way. If the moral status of the human embryo is derived from its forward-looking potentiality, then ANT and iPSC have none, and if the moral status of the embryo is derived from its backward-looking origination in human reproduction, then also SCNT as well as ANT and iPSC lack such status.

Devolder ends with a recognition of the practical need for differentiating between an epistemically ideal position and a formulation of reasonable policy in a pluralistic society. Throughout her book, however, she seems to reject a middle ground position of giving some regard to the moral status of the human embryo while at the same time incorporating a balanced consideration of biological as well as societal factors. While perhaps less than ideal, this is, nevertheless, the reality we live in. Devolder exposes some of the key moral inconsistencies in contemporary handling of human beginnings, but to some extent her argumentation lacks internal proportionality and does not help much in finding a place in the muddle.