The Ethics of Energy: William James's Moral Philosophy in Focus

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Sergio Franzese, The Ethics of Energy: William James's Moral Philosophy in Focus, Ontos, 2008, 237pp., $124.00 (hbk), ISBN 97838680118.

Reviewed by Kenneth W. Stikkers, Southern Illinois University, Carbondale


Every scholar and reader of William James is aware of his frequent uses of "energy," especially in his discussions of ethics and most notably in his 1906 Presidential Address to the American Philosophical Association, "The Energies of Men".[1] But while other interpretations treat James's use of "energy" as merely one of his several folksy metaphors, The Ethics of Energy: William James's Moral Philosophy in Focus is the first monograph, as its author, Sergio Franzese, rightly claims, to focus upon "energy" as a central concept in James's ethics. Ethics, for James, is not about values, goods, or principles but about the organization of energy, especially into habits, in the service of personal, aesthetic ideals. As such this book is an original and valuable addition to the literature on James, and it does much to bring James into closer dialogue with other recent efforts to rethink ethics without appeal to some rule of reason, whether it be in the form of an utilitarian calculus or a categorical imperative. Such efforts include those of Friedrich Nietzsche, whom Franzese discusses extensively, Max Scheler, whom he mentions only briefly (51-52), and especially Michel Foucault, whom he does not mention at all.

Previous scholars have missed the importance of "energy" in James's philosophy, and thereby have misunderstood his ethics, because, Franzese argues (11-17), they have uncritically followed Ralph Barton Perry's[2] early interpretation of James's 1891 essay "The Moral Philosopher and the Moral Life"[3] as an outline of some new ethical theory and thus missed the truly revolutionary thrust of that essay. Rather than merely adding one more ethical theory to the lot, James's essay was a radical assault upon ethical theory as such, "a critical analysis of the validity of any moral theory," "intended to show the futility of that traditional philosophical task" (3). The essay aimed to clear the ground for the rethinking of ethics radically anew, to rethink it, as the title implies, in relation to life, rather than as theory abstracted from life. Furthermore, James was not merely cashing in on the popular use of "energy" in his day, as he did with so many other popular terms. "Energy" meant for him no metaphysical substance but rather activity -- living itself (166) -- and for James the pluralist there could be no singular, universal form of right living. The task of ethics is therefore not to prescribe theoretically the features of some universal Good, under which all particular goods are to be arranged and to which all moral agents must submit, but to organize practically the energies of life in service to one's own personal and ideally unified desires and demands against evil, namely, against "limits on the full and free expression of human life" (7): "the ethics of energy does not set moral aims and values"; rather, "it is … the way in which one becomes the master and author of one's own energy" (199).

Readers of Foucault, like this reviewer, will find striking similarities between Franzese's recasting of James's ethics and Foucault's recovery of the ethics of the ancients, especially the Stoics, in Volumes 2 and 3 of The History of Sexuality.[4] They are so striking, indeed, that it is hard for this reviewer to imagine that Foucault was not at least in the back of Franzese's mind, even though Franzese never mentions him. What Foucault found so interesting in the ancients was their effort to think ethics not by reference to some externally imposed rule of reason, but out of the free creation and cultivation of one's self, the caring for oneself, as our highest aesthetic achievement. Foucault aims, like Franzese's James, to rethink ethics as an aesthetics of existence. Artistic works begin with identification of the materials with which one will work: out of what will one create one's work of art? So, Foucault suggests, aesthetics of existence begins with "determination of the ethical substance":[5] on what does one imagine oneself to be working in shaping one's life into a work of art? The pleasures? The desires? The will? Power? "Energy" enjoys certain advantages over metaphors identifying similar "ethical substances," such as "power," "force," or "will," because it connotes something much more primal and yet-unformed than they do. "Power," "force," and "will" all suggest energy already directionally organized, even with intent. Indeed, Franzese extensively contrasts James's "energy" to Nietzsche's "will to power" (193-201), and this contrast is a significant contribution to understanding relationships between the two thinkers. It seems surprising, however, that Franzese never mentions Foucault in this connection nor contrasts his notion of "power" to James's "energy."

One glaring gap in Franzese's proposed reading of James's ethics, and its greatest shortcoming, in this reviewer's opinion, is his relatively slim consideration of "experience" -- the most central notion in all of James's philosophy, in the judgment of virtually every leading interpreter -- and his radical empiricism. What does "energy" contribute to James's notion of "experience"? How does it fit in with James's radical empiricism? Considering the importance of the latter in James's philosophy, Franzese's discussion of the relationship between energy and experience seems too brief (164-69), although what he does suggest is very promising. We might delineate from his discussion two main suggestions, which Franzese runs together. The first is that "energy" is the more encompassing term because it can be taken both in an impersonal, cosmic form and in the form of personal consciousness. It is the "stuff" (my, not Franzese's, appropriation of James's term from his radical empiricism) -- metaphorically speaking -- both of my experience and of what I experience. Hence, its use maintains continuity between the activity of experience and the cosmos experienced and thus overcomes a number of traditional dualisms. It seems to me, though, that James's radical empiricism already accounts adequately for this continuity -- e.g., in "Does Consciousness Exist?" -- and "energy" adds little to that account. Franzese's second main suggestion, however, seems more to the point: "energy" accounts for the sense of aliveness from which all experience feels itself emanating. It thus corresponds to Bergson's notion of élan vital, what James describes, as Franzese quotes him, as the "live, active organic character of the universe" (166). It also corresponds to what Scheler, whom Franzese does not discuss in this context, terms "Lebensdrang," which Manfred Frings, the Editor of Scheler's Gesammelte Werke, translated initially as "life-urge" and later as "the impulse of life." Unfortunately, though, such vitalistic meanings are not natural connotations of "energy" but must be imputed to it. Hence, Bergson's and Scheler's terms are preferable if Franzese is correct about James's intent in his use of "energy."

Franzese's interpretation of James's ethics as an "ethics of energy" is definitely original. It offers much promise, especially because it provides a new avenue by which James can be brought into new, productive dialogue with other thinkers of his time who, like James, sought to rethink the modern West's general approach to ethics as an imposed rule of reason. For this reason Franzese's is a valuable contribution to James scholarship and should be of interest not only to James scholars but also to continental, "postmodern" ethicists, following, for example, Nietzsche, Heidegger, Derrida, or Foucault, and who previously might not have entertained any interest in James.

[1] Philosophical Review 16 (January 1907): 1-20, in William James, The Writings of William James: A Comprehensive Edition, ed. John J. McDermott (New York: The Modern Library, 1968), pp. 671-83.

[2] The Thought and Character of William James (Boston: Little Brown & Co., 1936).

[3] International Journal of Ethics 1 (1891): 330-54, in Writings, pp. 610-29.

[4] The Use of Pleasure, Vol 2 of The History of Sexuality, trans. Robert Hurley (New York: Vintage Books, 1990), and The Care of the Self, Vol. 3 of The History of Sexuality, trans. Robert Hurley (New York: Vintage Books, 1988).

[5] The Use of Pleasure, pp. 26-27.