The Ethics of Genetic Engineering

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Roberta M. Berry, The Ethics of Genetic Engineering, Routledge, 2007, 226pp., $140.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780415769945.

Reviewed by Sheldon Krimsky, Tufts University


Over the past decade there has been a small cottage industry of published books that address the ethical issues arising from new developments in biotechnology. They cover genetically modified food, transgenic animals, biological weapons, and a subject that accounts for the most volumes, the genetic modification of human beings. As a matter of historical interest, the ethical discussion around creating an uber mensch or in the contemporary jargon, a trans-human or genetically enhanced person, preceded the genetic engineering revolution of the early 1970s. French biologist Jean Rostand's book, Can Man be Modified? was translated into English in 1959.[1] Without knowing anything about cloning or stem cells, Rostand wrote:

If a biologist … takes any fragment of tissue from the freshly dead body … there is no absolute reason why we should not imagine the perfect science of the future remaking from such a culture, the complete person, strictly identical to the one who had furnished the principle.[2]

Rostand was speculating about the powers of science 50 years into the future and inquiring about the ethical conundrums they would create. Now we are there. In many respects, the science is still ahead of the ethics. Take, for example, the decision of the U.S. Patent & Trademark Office (USPTO) to deny a patent for the production of a chimera by cell fusion that combines the chromosomes of a human and a non-human animal into a viable embryo. The USPTO denied the patent on the grounds that the hybrid organism was too similar to a human being. Even though the chimera had not been created, to be seriously considered, the patent design had to have been sufficiently persuasive so that anyone familiar with the art of making animal chimeras would be able to make the human-animal embryo. While human beings cannot be patented, the processes used to genetically modify humans can be and have been patented. Whether and how those processes should be used is the subject of The Ethics of Genetic Engineering.

Roberta M. Berry has written a creative book on how ethics can inform individual decisions and social policy on human genetic engineering. The book focuses primarily on germline genetic modification. The discussions and analyses are largely aimed at prospective parents who wish to bring into the world a "more perfect" child, not by education or through nurturance of the child's creativity, but by engineering the child's genomes at the point of gestation. Perfection means being more resistant to disease or having other phenotypes that provide more than average advantages in society. Berry applies her skills as a trained philosopher to analyze issues that have been discussed largely by bioethicists in think tanks, university seminars, and professional journals, as well as among NGOs seeking to warn society about the new science of reproductive genetics looming on the horizon.

Whimsically, we might speak about this book as a philosopher's guide to Gattaca, the 1997 film about a future when genetic engineering makes possible the creation of biologically superior humans (known as "valids"), who enter positions of power and prestige.

When the human genome project got underway in the early 1990s and personalized genetics was seen as the next medical frontier, scientists and many bioethicists constructed an ethical firewall between somatic cell and germline gene therapy. The former was seen as a practical extension of drug therapy, although in this case the therapeutics is in the form of genetic materials that are delivered into the patient's cells. Germline gene therapy (or enhancement) was connected to eugenics because it involved planned genetic changes to future generations. This was a short-lived distinction as scientists broke away from any constraints on research. Berry's book, which assumes that germline gene enhancement of humans will eventually take place, prepares readers for new personal and societal choices that will be available to prospective parents. Beyond that the book offers readers a useful exegesis in practical ethics.

The book is divided into five chapters. Chapter 1 offers a broad brushstroke look into the early developments of genetic engineering leading to what the author refers to as "fractious problems", complex and divisive ethical problems resulting from breakthroughs in biomedical science. Chapters 2, 3 and 4 explore how the classical philosophies (utilitarianism, Kantianism, and virtue ethics) provide clarity and wisdom to the ethical choices associated with human germline genetic engineering or the genetic selection of embryos. In Chapter 5 the author explores the viewpoints of modern philosophers including John Rawls, Robert Nozick, Alasdair MacIntyre, Charles Taylor and Ronald Dworkin on changing the genetic architecture of humans. Berry also argues the case that virtue ethics provides the best framework for addressing the issues. "But it does not follow that a utilitarian calculus of welfare maximization or a deontological assessment of duties or rights is well-suited to parental or policy decision-making about revising the genomes of our future children."[3] When science is capable of circumventing the genetic lottery of biological meiosis between sperm and egg, we are faced with new personal and normative reproductive decisions, which become the focus of the book.

There are two qualities that distinguish this book from the pack. First, the author has a richer understanding of ethical theory than most writing in the field of "genome ethics." She uses a broad tapestry of ethical theories as lenses for analyzing problems. And second, Berry applies a creative form of dialogue between one person who personifies a physician, bioethicist and/or genetics counselor and two other individuals who are prospective parents. The dialogues are reminiscent of the Platonic and Galilean dialogues where different philosophical or scientific perspectives appear in the personages who question each other on issues of great public concern. From a teaching standpoint, Berry's dialogues will be useful in reaching students who may have difficulty in applying ethical theory to contemporary problems.

For example, the Kantian counselor explores the parents' right to do whatever is in their power (including genetic modification) to produce a superior child. The counselor says: "Although [your] purpose would be to gain additional opportunities for [your] children, the result of everyone extending their children's lives in an effort to gain a greater share of available opportunities would remain constant and even diminish over time."[4] Applying Kant's Categorical Imperative, the counselor concludes that the prospective parents cannot, without reaching a contradiction to their goals, universalize the maxim "I should act to genetically modify the ovum of my future child to gain additional opportunities." If, for example, height were the phenotype desired, and everyone was afforded the same opportunity to modify the ovum for greater height, there would be no advantage. While this is good Kantianism, it may not convince most people who wish to exercise every available advantage for their children. There are other considerations that are subsumed to the authority of science, namely, that safe genetic modification of the human genome is a myth that, if attempted, is likely to result in dangerous human pathologies.

The conclusion reached by Berry as to how society will resolve the problems brought on by the expected scientific capacity to engineer the human genome is optimistic but philosophically weak. It is based on the faith that a society which devotes itself to virtue (in education and practical life) will use appropriate forms of casuistry to navigate safely through the bramble bush of ethical conflicts. Berry writes that

Virtue ethics invites us to embrace all [ways of understanding] and it trusts that this will enable us to see not just a booming buzzing confusion, but what practical wisdom requires under all the facts and circumstances … so we can be as accomplished at acting from the virtues in making choices about genetic engineering as we are in making choices about other practical problems that we confront in daily life.[5]

Some would argue this is what currently exists as we cross the frontier of genetics and reproductive technology, namely ethical and social anarchism.

[1] Jean Rostand. Can Man be Modified? Translated from the French by Jonathan Griffin. New York: Basic Books, 1959.

[2] Rostand, 1959, pp. 13-14.

[3] Robert M Berry. The Ethics of Genetic Engineering. New York: Routledge, 2007, p. ix.

[4] Berry, 2007, p. 86.

[5] Berry, 2007, p. 154.