The Ethics of Giving: Philosophers' Perspectives on Philanthropy

Placeholder book cover

Paul Woodruff (ed.), The Ethics of Giving: Philosophers' Perspectives on Philanthropy, Oxford University Press, 2018, 224pp., $34.95 (hbk), ISBN 9780190648879.

Reviewed by Brian Berkey, University of Pennsylvania


This volume is a valuable contribution to the burgeoning discussion of the ethics of philanthropy, which has been spurred in recent years in large part by the growth of the effective altruism movement. It contains six chapters by authors representing a range of theoretical orientations in ethics, along with an introduction and a concluding "Afterword" essay by the editor.

There are two features that are especially noteworthy. The first is that none of the contributions that are critical of effective altruism rely on what I have elsewhere called the "institutional critique" (Berkey 2018), according to which effective altruism is objectionable in virtue of failing to recommend that individuals focus their efforts at least primarily on political action aimed at bringing about institutional changes that would address the "root causes" of poverty. Given the pervasiveness of this claim in critical discussions of effective altruism, and the fact that it is, in my view, unpersuasive, it is a welcome feature of the volume that it highlights alternative reasons why some might be skeptical of effective altruism.

The second noteworthy feature is that a type of justice-based argument for the view that at least many well off people are obligated to give substantially in order to improve the lives of the global poor is at least suggested, if not explicitly endorsed, in four of the chapters (i.e. those by Thomas E. Hill Jr., Jeff McMahan, and Elizabeth Ashford, plus Paul Woodruff's Afterword). The core of the argument is that because much of the wealth possessed by well off people is legally theirs only in virtue of the operation of unjust global and/or domestic institutions, they have no moral entitlement to it, and are obligated to redirect it in ways that will benefit those who are unjustly disadvantaged by the relevant institutions.

This is an important and plausible line of argument, and its success would, it seems to me, have quite radical implications. We would likely have to accept, for example, that well off people are obligated to refrain from living lifestyles that would be inaccessible to them under fully just institutions, both global and domestic, and to redirect the portion of their resources that they would not possess in a just world in ways that will benefit others. Given how much resistance there has been to demanding accounts of the obligations of the well off to the global poor since Peter Singer ignited the discussion of this issue (Singer 1972), it is striking that so many of the authors take this view seriously. The volume should lead others thinking about our obligations to respond to global injustice to do so as well.

Hill's discussion of the Kantian approach to the ethics of philanthropy makes several valuable contributions, in addition to highlighting familiar features of the Kantian approach. First, he notes that a proper application of Kantian theory to questions about philanthropy requires thinking about "midlevel moral principles for imperfect (nonideal) moral agents in an actual and dangerously imperfect world" (p. 20). He adds that this implies that the principles that we accept "should not be framed in utter disregard of the probability that in fact not everyone will do 'their fair share'" (p. 20). A proper Kantian account of our obligations of beneficence, then, might, according to Hill, turn out to be more demanding than views according to which we are obligated only to do our fair share (e.g. Murphy 2000).

In addition, Hill is one of the authors who highlight the justice-based argument described above. He notes that Kant's view seems unable to account for strict justice-based duties of reparation owed by those who benefit from unjust institutions to those disadvantaged by them (p. 34). But he adds that Kant's acknowledgement of the fact that significant wealth is often the result of the operation of unjust state institutions, along with his claim that the very rich should see their charitable giving as required, and not especially praiseworthy, together suggest that he may have viewed giving up resources possessed due to the operation of unjust institutions as an ethical duty (p. 34). Although it may be true that within the Kantian system this duty would not be classified as a duty of justice, it clearly has its grounds in the fact that its bearers are beneficiaries of injustice. And this, it seems to me, makes it the case that it will generate the same radical implications as views that explicitly cast the duties as duties of justice.

In her chapter, Christine Swanton approaches the ethics of philanthropy from a virtue-ethical perspective. She argues that a version of virtue ethics, which she calls "thick concept centralism," can resolve several widely discussed paradoxes of beneficence. According to thick concept centralism, the reason-providing status of features of an action, such as the fact that it will benefit people in need, should be understood at least partially in terms of "thick evaluative concepts such as kind, callous, generous" (p. 42). Whether the fact that an act is kind or generous provides a reason to perform it, on Swanton's view, depends on whether the kindness or generosity should, in the relevant circumstances, be regarded as virtuous, so that different versions of thick concept centralism will be associated with different theories of virtue (pp. 54-5).

This virtue-ethical view constitutes an alternative to views on which reasons of beneficence are understood in terms of the thought that, from an appropriately impartial perspective, every person, and every person's interests, are equally morally important. These views, Swanton claims, generate extremely demanding conclusions, and are

devoid of the human-specific meaning provided by the reason-supplying status of thick concepts, with their emotional conditions of intelligibility, in particular those relating to domains of human concern such as bonds with near and dear, one's own projects, and so on. (pp. 42-3)

Thick concept centralism, on the other hand, can ground the permissibility of forms of charitable giving that cannot be justified in impartialist terms, in particular when such giving exhibits what Swanton calls "narrative virtue" (pp. 65-6). According to her version of the view,

The bonds of love and loyalty, the bonds to self that drive prudence, are legitimate moral forces within a narrative context . . . The expression of love, solidarity, gratitude to a loved one or to one's community . . . may legitimately determine choice of charitable endeavor. (p. 66)

Swanton's view represents an interesting alternative to the impartialist approach to the ethics of philanthropy endorsed by effective altruists. It is not clear to me, however, that her approach can plausibly justify giving by the well off that primarily benefits loved ones or their local communities. It is noteworthy that there is no mention of the virtue of justice anywhere in her chapter. If, however, much of the wealth possessed by the well off is legally theirs only in virtue of the operation of unjust institutions, then there is good reason to think that not only keeping that wealth for oneself, but also using it in ways that advance the interests of other beneficiaries of injustice, is contrary to the virtue of justice. Swanton might be able to accept this, but to insist that sometimes other virtues, such as gratitude, can permissibly take priority over justice. But this, it seems to me, is a difficult view to defend, given that it would appear to legitimate the entrenchment of injustice.

McMahan's chapter addresses the question whether it can be impermissible to do some (but not the most) good, even if it is permissible, because of the sacrifice that would be involved, to do no good at all. After noting that there is something puzzling about this view (p. 81), he argues, persuasively in my view, that in some cases it is correct. Specifically, in cases in which one incurs the sacrifice the prospect of which makes it permissible to do no good, and is still in a position to choose whether to do more or less good, there is, he claims, no justification for refusing to do the most good. An agent in such a position is in the same position, morally speaking, as one who can do either more or less good at no (or very little) cost to herself (p. 87). And in cases of this kind, there is generally a requirement to do the most good.

In other cases, however, including most cases of charitable giving, the cost that might justify refraining from giving at all is not incurred prior to the choice between the lesser and the greater good, and so those who give are typically not in the position of one who can do either more or less good at no cost to herself (pp. 90, 100). Instead, given that those who give to less effective charities rather than more effective ones typically have reasons for doing so, such as that they care more about the work of the less effective organizations, that make it the case that giving to the more effective ones instead would, in some sense, be more costly to them (pp. 83-4), it is difficult to see how we can accept that there is a conditional obligation to do the most good that applies to charitable giving, such that giving that does not do the most good is wrong even though not giving at all is permissible. As McMahan helpfully puts it, if we accept that the cost to the agent of giving makes it permissible to refrain entirely,

a decision to do some good cannot create a duty to produce the greater good if that would require a personal cost that is even greater than that which would be necessary to produce the lesser good, which itself is a cost that she is not morally required to accept. (p. 86, italics in original)

McMahan's argument, if correct, would show that efforts by effective altruists to defend merely conditional obligations to give in ways that do the most good (e.g. Pummer 2016, Horton 2017) must fail. He suggests two ways that effective altruists might respond. The first, which he tentatively expresses some sympathy for, is to claim that there is a distinction that can be made between an act's being wrong and its being impermissible, and that while we must accept that giving that does less good is not impermissible in cases in which refraining from giving is permissible, it may nonetheless be wrong (pp. 99-100). He notes that he is not confident that this view is coherent (p. 100), and I am more skeptical about this than he appears to be. The second way that effective altruists might respond, which I find more plausible, is to abandon the aim of defending conditional obligations to do the most good, and instead argue that morality is very demanding, so that much more giving is obligatory than most people tend to accept (p. 101).[1]

It is worth noting that McMahan accepts that, at least for the very wealthy, much giving is obligatory, for reasons that are broadly consistent with the justice-based argument that I have emphasized. Leona Helmsley, he says,

had legal rights to more resources than it could have been morally justifiable for her to own, possess, or control. Most of her money . . . was legally but not morally hers . . . That which she was not morally entitled to retain, she was morally required to give away. But because she had no moral entitlement to that which she was required to give away, her wishes in the matter of its disposal were morally irrelevant. (p. 80)

Ashford develops a version of the justice-based argument for obligations to give. She argues that it can provide the basis for responses to many of the criticisms that have been made of effective altruism, in particular those made by proponents of the "institutional critique." She shares with McMahan the view that many of the resources possessed by the well off are not, morally speaking, theirs (pp. 104, 111, 122), and claims that this justice-based framing of questions about our obligations to the global poor "calls for reform of global and domestic economic, political and legal structures" (p. 104). On her view, it is important that effective altruists acknowledge the profound injustice of the present state of affairs, and avoid framing the moral issues arising from severe poverty in ways that suggest that affluent agents "start from a clean moral slate" (p. 107), and simply have strong reasons to give to effective charities in virtue of the fact that they are in a position to do a great deal of good (pp. 121-2). Instead, she argues, the duties that affluent agents have to give to effective charities should be understood as "backup duties" (p. 108), which kick in when the shared duty that we have to bring about institutions that ensure that everyone's human rights are protected has gone, and can be expected to continue to go, unfulfilled (p. 108).

There is a great deal that seems to me correct in Ashford's view, and it does seem to help make effective altruist responses to many of the objections that have been made against it more plausible. She is clear that it would be much better if affluent agents fulfilled their (shared) primary duty to create institutions that protect everyone's human rights than for the global poor to be dependent on them to comply with backup duties to give to effective charities (p. 118). But she rightly insists that rejecting the view that the affluent are obligated to give to effective charities because poverty is the result of deeply unjust global institutions is to endorse a kind of "double wrong[ing]" of the global poor (p. 119). Given that the human rights of the global poor are currently unprotected (the first wrong), the affluent surely ought not refuse to support effective organizations that would at least mitigate the devastating effects of our unjust institutions. This, as Ashford puts it,

brings out the absurdity of the assumption (which tends to be implicit in certain objections to effective altruism rather than explicitly stated) that acknowledgement of the unjust structural underpinnings of severe poverty implies that we should avoid supporting aid agencies. (p. 119)

While I am persuaded by much in Ashford's chapter, there is one issue that seems to me in need of some clarification. She claims that affluent individuals have a "shared duty" to bring about institutional reforms that would ensure that everyone's human rights are protected, in addition to having backup duties to donate to effective charities. Shared duties, on her view, are "held by individual agents, but each agent has only partial responsibility for [their] fulfillment" (p. 130). These two kinds of duties, she claims, should be understood as complementing each other, rather than being in competition. While this seems like an appealing view, we must still face the question how individuals ought to employ the limited time and resources at their disposal. Should they split them between efforts at institutional reform and supporting effective charities? If so, in what proportions? Should they simply do whatever has the highest expected value, however that should be understood (presumably at least partially in terms of promoting justice-relevant values)? Ashford does not say much about this question, but competing answers to it seem to me to represent an important dividing line between effective altruists and their opponents, and the view that, in principle, we can have duties to do both kinds of things does not by itself reconcile the competing views.

In his chapter, Brandon Boesch develops an argument against the view that our charitable donations should be guided exclusively by the aim of doing the most good, drawing on Bernard Williams's integrity-based critique of utilitarianism. On Boesch's view, "certain causes are potentially more choiceworthy for an agent because of her commitments, her own history and background" (p. 151). He does not deny that we are obligated to give potentially substantial amounts to charity (p. 154), and he allows that there are circumstances in which strong impartial reasons for donating where the resources would do the most good should win out, all things considered, over reasons to donate elsewhere provided by factors like an agent's projects and commitments (pp. 163, 173). But he argues that views according to which our charitable contributions should always be directed where they will do the most good, impartially understood, are objectionable because they imply that it is impermissible to develop identities in accordance with commitments that arise out of, for example, being a member of a particular community (pp. 165-7). On his view, we are permitted to have and develop these kinds of identities, and an essential part of having them is acting "for the sake of" the commitments that they entail (p. 160). And this requires that, for example, a person who has as part of her identity being a committed citizen of a particular town at least seriously consider donating (a part of) her limited charitable budget to causes that will benefit her fellow community members.

Boesch's extension of Williams's critique, and in particular his discussion of identities as features of ourselves that we can exercise control over and develop over time, is a valuable contribution. I am, however, unpersuaded for two reasons. First, it is not clear to me that views according to which we are morally obligated to make substantial sacrifices in order to promote the good, impartially conceived, do in fact "threaten our ability to exercise any sort of choice over the development of certain identities" (p. 161) in a way that is objectionable. Rather, we might think, they merely imply that we ought to cultivate identities in a way that is consistent with a proper appreciation for the fact that every person, and every person's interests, are equally morally important. Second, the view that well off people are entitled to seriously consider donating to causes that are closely tied to their chosen and cultivated identities, and very often permitted to donate to such causes, seems clearly inconsistent with accepting the core of the justice-based argument according to which the well off are not morally entitled to significant portions of the resources that they legally possess.

William MacAskill, Andreas Mogensen, and Toby Ord's chapter draws on empirical evidence in order to argue that a requirement that the affluent donate ten percent of their income to effective organizations that aid the global poor should be understood as undemanding, and should therefore be accepted even by those who believe that morality cannot be particularly demanding. They make their argument by describing evidence that suggests that the effects on a well off person's well being of giving away ten percent of her income would likely be minimal, and may even be positive, all things considered (pp. 184-9), as well as evidence that the benefits that donations can provide for those in need are quite significant (pp. 189-96). Given that whether a purported obligation can plausibly be thought to be objectionably demanding depends both on the extent of the costs of compliance and the extent of the benefits that would be provided to others,[2] the fact that the costs of giving ten percent appear to be low or nonexistent, and the fact that the benefits that could be provided appear to be quite substantial, together provide a powerful case for thinking that the well off are in fact obligated to give at least that much.

The volume concludes with Woodruff's Afterword, which focuses on the role that considerations of justice should play in decisions about charitable giving. Woodruff endorses the view defended by Ashford, and suggested by McMahan and Hill, that "those who have profited from unjust structures have no right to their wealth" (p. 206). He compares the obligations of beneficiaries of unjust institutions to those of people who have come into possession of stolen goods -- "If they return [the wealth that they possess] to those who have been deprived, they are in effect returning stolen goods to their owners" (p. 206). Unlike Ashford, Woodruff suggests that the force of the analogy to the obligation to return stolen property that has come into one's possession suggests that the well off will often have obligations to direct resources in ways that do not do the most good -- "your duties of making restitution are particular: your beneficiaries must be among those who lost wealth as a result of your accumulation" (p. 207). In addition, he thinks that we can come to have obligations to contribute to particular causes in virtue of having benefitted from particular opportunities. For example, he claims that a person who benefitted from a subsidized Princeton education acquires a duty of justice to contribute her fair share to the provision of education for others, even if donating to other causes would do more good (p. 210). These justice-based obligations, on Woodruff's view, compete with obligations of philanthropy of the kind that effective altruists endorse, and at least sometimes take priority (p. 213).

While I find the analogy between beneficiaries of unjust institutions and possessors of stolen goods helpful for thinking about the justice-based obligations of the well off, I am not convinced that it provides reasons for doubting that we should direct our contributions in whatever way will do the most good. Whether it does depends on what the correct theory of justice looks like. If it is a cosmopolitan theory according to which every person is entitled to at least sufficient resources to live a minimally decent life, then all of the global poor should be thought of as unjustly disadvantaged by the institutions from which the well off benefit, in which case there would not seem to be any basis for prioritizing efforts that benefit certain people who are disadvantaged and not others. I am also puzzled by Woodruff's endorsement of obligations to support particular causes, such as education, when we have benefitted from institutions of the relevant type. It is unclear what moral reasons there might be for individuating causes in the way that he suggests, and if well off people direct substantial portions of their charitable resources to institutions of types from which they have benefitted, this could have a tendency to entrench injustice rather than ameliorating it.

Despite my concerns, however, Woodruff's contribution, along with those of the other contributors that I have noted, to the development of the justice-based argument for the view that the well off have potentially demanding obligations to direct resources to those who are disadvantaged by unjust institutions, represents an important step forward in the ongoing debates about the ethics of philanthropy, effective altruism, and global justice.


Berkey, Brian. "Double Counting, Moral Rigorism, and Cohen's Critique of Rawls: A Response to Alan Thomas." Mind 124: 849-74.

Berkey, Brian. "The Demandingness of Morality: Toward a Reflective Equilibrium." Philosophical Studies 173: 3015-35.

Berkey, Brian. 2018. "The Institutional Critique of Effective Altruism." Utilitas 30: 143-71.

Horton, Joe. 2017. "The All or Nothing Problem." Journal of Philosophy 114: 94-104.

Murphy, Liam B. 2000. Moral Demands in Nonideal Theory. New York: Oxford University Press.

Pummer, Theron. 2016. "Whether and Where to Give." Philosophy and Public Affairs 44: 77-95.

Singer, Peter. 1972. "Famine, Affluence, and Morality." Philosophy and Public Affairs 1: 229-43.

[1] I offer a way of pursuing this approach in Berkey 2016.

[2] I defend this view in Berkey 2015.